Rethinking Jewish Philosophy: Beyond Particularism and Universalism

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Aaron W. Hughes, Rethinking Jewish Philosophy: Beyond Particularism and Universalism, Oxford University Press, 2014, 170pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199356812.

Reviewed by Kenneth Seeskin, Northwestern University


Among its other virtues, the book boasts an accurate and descriptive title: its purpose is to argue that the dominant trend in Jewish philosophy has run aground because of its reliance on artificially constructed categories like universal/particular, Jew/non-Jew, and Jerusalem/Athens. In that respect, it is an exercise in what Aaron Hughes calls "Jewish metaphilosophy." He takes issue with the rationalist tendencies that emerged from the nineteenth century movement known as Wissenschaft des Judentums as well as the particularist tendencies that one finds in the work of Franz Rosenzweig. Whatever one thinks of the substance of Hughes' arguments, there is no getting around the fact that he writes with flare and knows his sources extremely well. I am not aware of any recent book in the field of Jewish philosophy that presents as serious a challenge to those who practice it as this one.

Before getting to substance, let me offer something by way of introduction. The field of Jewish philosophy has always suffered from a lack of consensus on how to define it. If one were to teach a course on comparative religion in a modern university, one would likely include Christianity, Islam, Buddhism, Hinduism, and Judaism. By the same token, if one were to list the nationalities that have played an important role in Western culture since 1492, one would likely include the French, Dutch, Germans, British, Spanish, Italians, Irish, Poles, and Jews. Note that Jews are the only group that gets mentioned twice. This has led to a long-standing question: Is Judaism primarily a religion defined by practice and belief or a nationality defined by group identity? How one answers this question will determine how one understands the discipline of Jewish philosophy.

No one questions that Maimonides, Mendelssohn, Cohen, Rosenzweig, Buber, and Levinas belong to this discipline. But what does one do with Philo, whose influence was mainly on early Christianity, Spinoza, who was excommunicated, Bergson, Husserl, or Wittgenstein? Even apart from Judaism, the problem of defining philosophy in terms of nationality has always been problematic. No one would bat an eye if one were to say that Aristotle is a central figure in Islamic philosophy, Frege in Anglo-American philosophy, or Husserl in French philosophy.

The result is that anyone who works in the field of Jewish philosophy has to cut Hughes a fair amount of slack. The categories that we use to describe the discipline are artificial to a great extent and reflect current academic or ideological biases. But Judaism is not the only culprit. In the 1980's, Richard Rorty argued that there is no identifiable method or body of results that would allow one to categorize such diverse thinkers as Parmenides, Aristotle, Descartes, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Russell, and Derrida as philosophers. To go a step further, if we were to look closely at the categories we use to teach the history of philosophy, e.g., Neo-Platonist, rationalist, empiricist, existentialist, we might conclude that they are useful ways of organizing complicated material and teaching people how to think about it. But if we were to look at them closely with the eyes of a specialist, we would see that the boundaries of these categories are porous and that searching for an essence that all figures share is mainly a waste of time.

As Hughes shows in detail, take something as ill-defined as Judaism, put it together with something as ill-defined as philosophy, and you are asking for trouble. You are asking for even more trouble if you think of Judaism as representing the particular and philosophy as representing the universal. In Hughes' words: "At the heart of Jewish philosophy is fracture and dislocation. . . . As philosophy, this activity makes claims to universal validity, but as an activity by a specific group of people, it must of necessity be inherently particularistic" (p. 1). In a manner reminiscent of Hegel and championed by Derrida, Hughes proceeds to show that dichotomies like universal/particular play off against each other and serve to destabilize each other. Instead, he proposes: "a Derridean-inspired reading of these two terms, one that argues that meaning does not arise out of fixed differences, but is produced and performed in ways that are always partial and provisional through différance, in which differential meanings are endlessly deferred" (p. 2).

To be more specific, the problem with Jewish philosophy is that to overcome the impossibility of the task it sets for itself, it has to provide a picture of what "authentic" Judaism amounts to. In Hughes' opinion, this often leads to the claim that the philosopher has uncovered Judaism in its pristine, timeless, or original form. There are two problems with such an approach. First, the idea of a pristine form of Judaism unencumbered by modern or outside influences is a construction (read: fantasy) at odds with what the historical record shows to be the case. A good example of this tendency is Maimonides' contention that the patriarchs and Moses discovered physics and metaphysics before the Greeks but that due to centuries of political oppression, the records of their accomplishments have been lost. Second, once someone claims to have shown the way to authentic Judaism, it is difficult not to marginalize or even ignore everything deemed to be inauthentic. Turning to Maimonides once again, anyone who believes that God is material or even that God has multiple attributes does not count as Jewish. If this were to be enforced rigorously, it would mean that in any age, the majority of Jews would have to be read out of the faith. This is all a way of saying that the search for authenticity culminates in fantasy or dogmatism, often both.

Another of Hughes' complaints is the degree to which Jewish philosophy sees its task as apologetic. To defend Judaism against its nineteenth century critics, the Wissenschaft movement tried to show that it was just as rational and therefore just as worthy of being taught in the academy as the Christianity seen through the lens of Kant or Hegel. To accomplish this, they had to ignore the mystical tradition or regard it as an embarrassment that distorted the true meaning of the religion. Again from Hughes:

Jewish philosophy and also its academic study thus potentially make the tradition into something that it is not. In the desire to make the tradition conform to a standard of rationality it has created in its own image, Jewish philosophy creates a highly selective narrative that risks distortion or, at the very least, betrays a certain privileging. (p. 18)

The Scylla and Charybdis of Jewish philosophy turn out to be Maimonides, on the side of universal rationality, and Rosenzweig, on the side of a blood-based particularity. One sought to take truth from whatever source it may originate and show that Judaism not only could, but in almost every instance, already had accommodated it. The other sought to define Judaism in terms of a timeless spirituality grounded in national identity. Both argued for the superiority of Judaism over other religions. In Hughes' opinion, both offered fantasy under the guise of philosophy.

Is this a fair assessment? As someone who is sympathetic to the Wissenschaft tradition, I have my doubts. Yes, the Wissenschaft people were apologetic, as were many of the medieval thinkers; but they had good reason to be. Jews have always been a small people trying to sustain their existence in a world governed by larger forces, whether secular or religious. So the question "Why should people who are not Jewish be interested in what Jews have to say?" has always been relevant. It was especially relevant in the context of Europe after the French Revolution, when Napoleon asked the Jewish community of France why they wanted to remain Jewish now that the Republic was willing to accept them as French. When they answered that they wanted to be French Jews, Napoleon became skeptical, at times even resentful. And Napoleon represented liberalism. For many people, Jews were a separate nation and therefore had no legitimate claim to being French, German, Polish, Dutch, or anything else except Jewish.

From a theological standpoint, the situation was just as bad. To this day, much of Christian theology is based on the claim of supercessionism. Kant thought Judaism was not a religion at all, while Hegel associated it with the unhappy consciousness. If Christianity has superseded Judaism, why should European academies study Judaism as anything but an ancient relic? Even the old Athens/Jerusalem dichotomy so beloved by undergraduate humanities courses is something of a misnomer if one takes the time to realize that for many people, "Jerusalem" not only includes but is epitomized by Jesus and Paul.

At a time when many Jews had no access to European academies, the Wissenschaft people set out to show that Jewish sources were worth studying in their own right. In order to secure a seat for Judaism at the table, they stressed the universal appeal of its principles and the methods used to investigate it. Undoubtedly they went too far; but it is well to remember that without their contribution, neither Hughes nor I would be teaching what we now teach at secular institutions. As one of the most important practitioners of Wissenschaft des Judentums, Hermann Cohen was perfectly open about the fact that his "Religion of Reason" out of Jewish sources was a theoretical construction rather than a historical description. In fact, he was proud of it. He was also aware that there was never a pristine past in Jewish history to which we should try to return. On the contrary, his view of Judaism was future-oriented and best described as messianic. He also went too far in making his case, but what thinker of genius did not?

Like all people who engage in the practice of metaphilosophy, Hughes often speaks at a high level of generality. He is at his best when deconstructing the standard dichotomies, which are, as he argues, both constructed and imposed. He is less successful when trying to point the way to something different. In a critical passage near the end (p. 115), he insists that his is not simply a deconstructive agenda. But when it comes to the Jewish philosophy of the future, his suggestion (p. 124) is that it focus on the themes of displacement, exile, and the meaning of Jewish sovereignty in Israel. Needless to say, these are issues worth considering. But it is anyone's guess whether reflection on them will lead to works as rich as those produced by the people Hughes takes to task.

To sum up, this is by any estimation a thought-provoking book, one which everyone in the field of Jewish philosophy and many outside of it will be expected to have read. If I were as rich as Croesus, I would fund an international conference at which leading scholars discussed it in detail. There is no doubt in my mind that the discipline would be much better off for having engaged with it.