Rethinking Order after the Laws of Nature

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Nancy Cartwright and Keith Ward (eds.), Rethinking Order after the Laws of Nature, Bloomsbury, 2016, 240pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474244060.

Reviewed by John F. Halpin, Oakland University


It is all too easy, even three centuries after Newton, to assume that everything, deep down, is governed by universal laws. Newton's principles are simple, provide powerful state transition laws, and are easily extended as new forces are discovered. Moreover, over the centuries Newton's laws have been successfully transformed to provide today's basic principles of physics, often as a version of Schrodinger's equation. Such principles of nature govern and/or determine a future state of the world and (perhaps only probabilistically) events. But such fundamental laws, "master principles", are not the only way to understand science and its underlying metaphysical lesson. Indeed, the contributors to this volume explain how this may be a very limited interpretation of science.

One of the editors, Nancy Cartwright, has pressed this point since the time of her How the Laws of Physics Lie (1983) and The Dappled World (1999). At bottom, on her view, there are causal powers discernable by their manifestation in isolation. But there are no true fundamental principles governing powers working together. Instead science is to establish a patchwork of local ceteris paribus and causal laws together with a plurality of models, typically partial, all working at different levels or scales. This is the "dappled" worldview. This book's main contribution is to further motivate this kind of view and to examine its wider philosophical and theological consequences.

The volume has many merits. Its subject matter is an important contender in philosophy of science debates on realism and representation, yet its metaphysical and theological consequences have not been fully developed. The contributors all more-or-less endorse the "dappled" worldview and the result is a strikingly coherent collection. Individually the contributions are clear and interesting. Furthermore, they are written with a broad audience in mind. One need not be a philosopher of science to comprehend the chapters devoted to issues of scientific representation and the order described, nor trained in metaphysics to appreciate the later chapters devoted to agency, free will, and natural theology. I should say that some claims in Keith Ward's introduction about how the dappled world perspective will "destroy" or cause the "collapse" of alternative viewpoints is hyperbolic to say the least. Still, I have no other complaints here. This introduction is clear and each chapter of the collection begins with his short and very useful "editorial links" putting the content into the perspective of the larger project. Other more historical pieces round out the general introductory material. One minor criticism: I think that the chapters dedicated to natural theology emphasize historical matters and thus are a bit thin regarding how the dappled worldview may "resonate" with the theological. I'll argue below for one way to flesh them out.

The central chapters explore the systematic description of orders distinct from any universal fundamental laws. This group of articles begins with a study of complexity theory and the spontaneous generation of order at higher levels. Robert C. Bishop and Roman Frigg's "From Order to Chaos and Back Again" also describes a brief history of classical physics especially as it confronts complexity and chaos. Though simple systems may have exact and computationally tractable solutions, many complex systems have complex, non-linear dynamics and solutions that are highly sensitive to the initial conditions: chaos. Still, under the right conditions interesting higher-level orders emerge. Simple, local interactions at the lower level lead to patterns, organizations, or coordination at a global level: from molecular growth to flocking behavior, and from galaxy formation to brain structure. Bishop and Frigg highlight a familiar example: Rayleigh-Bénard convection structures in fluids including boiling water and ranging all the way to the air currents of a hurricane. Here, rather than strict-state transition principles that might or might not govern at the bottom and might or might not be chaotic, rough but stable patterns "self-organize" at a more interesting and useful level of analysis. Moreover, as Bishop and Frigg explain, the kind of patterns emerging even in the kitchen pot are contingent on the details (obviously, temperature changes matter greatly), can be described causally at the higher level (so there is a kind of downward causation: the current carries the molecules), and provide qualitative explanatory value (we may be best able to explain at the large scale even if this involves a less quantitative account). Bishop and Frigg's pluralistic bottom line is this: self-organization serves as a model for how and why science for complex systems has moved beyond the methods of fundamental physics.

Biology provides fertile grounds for exploring this local, emergent order and its pluralistic representation. Eric Martin and William Bechtel describe this in detail in "Multiple Orders in Biology." They point out that the study of life can provide few generalities beyond extraction of energy from the environment, growth, and reproduction. Instead, biology needs to bring order to a wide range of life-forms and does so by various means. They describe three: classification, analysis via life's mechanisms, and descent via inheritance.

However, they point out, none of these is as neat as may have been hoped. Classification systems are interest-dependent rather than joint-carving. Mechanistic explanations take dynamic, non-linear forms. Their feedback mechanisms remind one of complex computation rather than, for example, a simple Watt's governor in a steam engine. Even natural selection with order by descent with adaption proceeds with unexpected complexity. Inheritance is not always parent-to-offspring but includes at least some "horizontal" gene transfer. Bacteria within a generation can share genes. Moreover, bacteria have adapted to the environments inside plant and animal cells, a process called endosymbiosis, to allow for some of the most important aspects of life, namely photosynthesis and ATP production. The main point I take from Martin and Bechtel is: unlike fundamental physics that strives for a simple set of basic principles, no one biological approach can be seen underlying the biology enterprise. Instead, the complexity of biological representation is growing richer (not simpler) with models describing deeper organization in nature.

John Dupré's "Realism, Pluralism, and Naturalism in Biology" is a nice complement to Martin and Bechtel's description of biological modeling. A useful model in the biological realm, Dupré argues, cannot be perfectly accurate and complete (any more than a useful map could describe absolutely every detail of the landscape). Good biology requires realism at least about the fundamental entities described and so, for practicality, a plurality of overlapping models. His key example makes the point. A chromosome can be represented with a sequence of nucleic acids, with the 3-D structure of the double helix, or with the support proteins that give it structure. Still, this leaves out other aspects of the environment working to reshape the structure to allow some and disallow other nucleotides to be active in messenger RNA production. It is never practical to describe all aspects of a chromosome in its environment. Instead, different partial but mostly accurate models are needed at different times.

Now, Dupré notes, a reductionist might hope for a micro-description of everything just described, chromosome plus environment in all details. Such description would be impractical but perhaps possible in principle. Still, following Dupré, the open nature of a biological system means that there may be no end to what counts as needed in a complete reductionist model. As soon as one describes a plant's energy needs or any organic object's atomic content, one requires cosmic scale for the full picture. As Dupré points out, this circumstance usually means retreat to global supervenience: anything biological is determined by the underlying physical structures of the entire universe. This is, Dupré writes, "vacuity that verges on the meaningless" (112). Here I think one should agree for standard biology; global dependence on the physical is not of interest to that practice. Still, all chapters following Dupre's are concerned with questions of conscious persons with free will or questions regarding theological matters. These concerns may depend on the failure of this global supervenience. So, while Dupré has made a very plausible case for partial, patchwork representation in biology and for a wholly natural world, the volume remains open to metaphysical issues regarding non-natural emergence.

Nancy Cartwright's chapter is aptly titled "The Dethronement of Laws in Science". The laws to be dethroned are the supposed fundamental ones. Ceteris paribus, phenomenological, or causal laws, she notes, have a continued central place in science. But an underlying fundamental physics that covers all physical events is not a part of the physics as we know it. Instead, she argues, we find lots of theories and models with overlapping domains and defined with "incommensurable" languages. When the domains overlap, a negotiation is required to find a successful application, say, in a laboratory. Still, were many of the best models deducible from first principles, then it might seem that physics would be approaching a Theory of Everything. Instead, as Cartwright describes, theoretical models in physics typically depend on both high-level theory, evidence and approximations coming from phenomenological or classical physics approximations, and observational data. Now, she admits, it remains possible that physics governs it all while our limited intellectual and evidential resources are to blame for the patchwork. Indeed, physicists do frequently take this view, claiming that computational complexity is an insurmountable issue in the case Cartwright has in mind, e.g., modeling nuclear structure. Still, back to Cartwright's stated argument, the dappled world is the "simplest, most natural" extrapolation from the evidence of current successful practice. (45)

In her final sections, Cartwright spells out her current view and its connection to larger metaphysical issues. The order we find in the world, local and fragile, is grounded in causal powers. So, for example, quarks have certain powers dependent on nuclear forces, and "order results from stable arrangements of different features with different powers acting in consort" (49). Because there are few true general principles, there is no general account of all powers that might arise nor a full account of just how disparate powers combine, and so there will not always be a determinate outcome for happenings in a situation. (To be clear, Cartwright has argued that there is no true law like Newton's designed to sum powers.) Consequently, there is only a patchwork order in the real world. Some systems are covered by causal laws, others by no laws at all. Hence, there is an openness to the dappled world. As Cartwright notes, this provides room for powers not countenanced by physical science and perhaps for genuine agency that can be responsible for its choices. (49-50)

The standard concern for genuine agency is that determinism precludes free will by eliminating real options while indeterminism also undermines free will but by leaving options open only through brute randomness. T.J. Mawson in "Freedom and the Causal Order" and Steven Horst in "From Laws to Powers" endorse and defend agent causation and libertarian free will, a version of indeterminism meant to evade the randomness concern. An agent cause is supposed to be a substance outside the normal fray of events; it is something of a first cause for what it does yet still can be said to choose for reasons. Such agents have long been supposed non-natural (insofar as they are coherent!) because they seem to require a new kind of power operating outside the laws of nature. But Mawson and Horst describe and develop the opening coming from the dappled view: the world has no nomically determinate set of powers nor is it always law governed. A Mawson-Horst agent is an emergent power, reasoning and choosing at gaps where there are no laws to determine actions.

Horst provides a very useful classification of laws including several empiricist varieties, the causal capacity account, and his own "cognitive pluralist account". His main point is that there are several reasonable ways to understand lawfulness and order in nature with gaps, and so without undermining free will. The cognitive pluralist account is an interesting example. On this account, laws are grounded in nature but also depend on or are relative to human conceptual interests and capabilities. They express "bracketing idealizations" meant to describe the partial and potential contributions of some causes without totalizing. Any total truth exceeds human grasp and we are best served with a pluralism of representations. Free agents, "anomic forces", are one option for human representation. (179)

In the end, though, Horst writes that free agent causation "might be understood in cognitivist terms as a way human minds conceptualize the actions of agents that is orthogonal to how we conceive of nomic causation" (181). Though not clearly intended, this view may be consistent with a view of the human agent and its freedom as a matter of stance: namely, Daniel Dennett's intentional stance that is "orthogonal" to a physical stance. (As Horst notes, the stereotype of an empiricist law, one only attributing behavior, is problematic. For example, Newton's gravitational law understood as describing acceleration is false for objects resting on the surface of the earth. I'd say the stereotype is problematic for another reason: many if not most empiricists describe laws in terms of "attraction" or "force" not behavior.)

Mawson proposes a naturalistic (non-dualist) agent cause. This agent is supposed to take advantage of nomic gaps in the brain and so cause the right neurological effects without breaking laws. The envisioned agent is one which makes atomic, chemical, or neuronal changes in just the right parts of the brain: those places where a change will have the desired effect, say raising the arm, but also right in that they are places devoid of operative laws and so where a change will break no law. Put so baldly this is an amazing power to postulate, an agent as demon. How does it get so well informed about just where and how to act? Perhaps natural selection could pick any agent causes that hook up to causal pathways toward advantageous action. But I fail to see the survival advantage in picking the nomic gaps.

If the agent must be terrifically competent to manipulate a brain, we may need to move to the realm of theology. The volume does just that. Ward's "Concepts of God and the Order of Nature" is a primarily historical account of the concept of God. Most importantly, the history builds toward "open theology, which espouses the non-deterministic nature of the God-world relation" (217). Part of his suggestion is that God, "a spiritual being of great wisdom and power" could, if real, develop a dappled universe along with something like Mawson's agent causes; "traditional theology would call them souls". (219) Of course, some will be disappointed if God must be postulated to make sense of an otherwise natural agent cause. Still, Russell Re Manning's "From Order to God" gives two dappled world-view arguments from design to back up the postulation. First, without God, order has no reason to persist, and there is only accidental activity which is "in effect, to dis-order order". So, if there truly is order in the dappled world, God needs to be responsible for it: "God provides and sustains it." (230) Second, though "according to the new thinking about order, [as described in Rethinking Order] order is messy and piecemeal: hardly designed order at all." But really this is an advantage for the design argument as we should "favour the idea of God as an involved and situated designer, rather than a dispenser (Henry Ford-like) of one size fits all productions via rigid and unresponsive laws of nature" (232).

Perhaps something stronger can be said to bolster the argument from design in a dappled world. Again, the dappled-world idea is that fundamentally there are powers rather than laws. So, the contemporary argument for the fine-tuning of the laws of nature might seem to be off the table. However, that argument is easily given in terms of powers. One part of that argument goes something like this: If either the strong or the weak nuclear force were just a bit different in strength, then basic nuclear structures would be unstable and things like hydrogen and water would not exist in large quantities. Likewise, the argument goes, the synthesis of the carbon nucleus in large stars depends on the fine-tuning of these forces or powers. So, if powers are real as described by the dappled worldview, then there is a need to explain why they are so exactly right. This may lead some to conclude that God likely exists and sets things right so that the universe can contain life. On the other hand, one may also reasonably take this modeling sensitivity as a reason to question the reality of the causal powers.