Rethinking Philosophy and Theology with Deleuze: A New Cartography

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Brent Adkins and Paul R. Hinlicky, Rethinking Philosophy and Theology with Deleuze: A New Cartography, Bloomsbury, 2013, 253pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441188250.

Reviewed by Christopher Penfield, Purdue University


As is immediately suggested by the title of their book, Brent Adkins and Paul Hinlicky have undertaken the ambitious project of re-orienting how we conceive of philosophy, theology, and the contemporary relations between them. In order to provide 'a new cartography' of philosophical and religious thought, which would not chart their boundary lines so much as the points of connection and productive tension between them, the authors argue that the familiar framework by which reason is separated from faith must be systematically called into question. Adkins and Hinlicky locate the specifically modern version of this dualism in Kant's absolute distinction between sensibility and intelligibility (3-4). This distinction is then argued to be fundamental not only for transcendental idealism, but also for the dividing line that cleaves modern metaphysics, splitting the domains proper to philosophy and theology: "Our claim is that Kant's fundamental metaphysical presupposition, which we'll call discontinuity, results in an insuperable division between being as such and the highest being" (1).

It will be noted straightaway that although Adkins and Hinlicky describe their book as an experimental essay in metaphysics, the problem posed by what they term the 'discontinuity thesis' is chiefly a theological one. However, since this problem is inherited from Kant, a proper response to it will require a different kind of metaphysics that affirms the 'continuity thesis' over and against a certain Kantian tradition (read: from German Idealism through phenomenology and psychoanalysis to deconstruction and the 'theological turn' of recent French thought). Here the authors turn to Deleuze, whose conceptual framework is enlisted not only as an alternative to Kantian dualism, but perhaps more surprisingly as the impetus for a new formulation of Christian theology.

Adkins and Hinlicky's book is thus structured into a first, philosophical part and a second, theological one. The first part sets out to show how Kant's discontinuity thesis institutes a gulf between reason and faith: one which has only been deepened by the legacy of transcendental analysis in the 20th century, as exemplified in Heidegger and Derrida; which impoverishes modern theology, whose claims are restricted by philosophy to the apophatic kind that cannot attribute anything positively of God; and which can only be overcome by rethinking the nature and relations of philosophy, theology, and religion on the basis of metaphysical continuity. If Deleuze is the main theoretical inspiration and resource guiding the book's first half, he is the conceptual point of embarkation for the second, which aims to construct a kataphatic or positive form of Christian theology that would be consistent with an ontology of immanence. This theology, which takes seriously Nietzsche's double critique of religious transcendence and the humanist subject, builds an account of theologico-political subjectivity that issues a challenge to contemporary Christian thought. It also offers a corrective to recent philosophical appropriations of St. Paul by Žižek, Badiou, and Agamben.

The authors' general critical argument can be put as follows. The problem with the discontinuity thesis is that it posits a difference in kind between the terms it sets apart (whether intelligibility and sensibility, doer and deed, Being and beings, condition and conditioned, Creator and creation, etc.). However, since difference in kind between discontinuous terms is still a relation, albeit one that would seem to lack a common measure, some further account must be given for how the terms are related. Typically, an appeal is made here to hylomorphism, depicting difference in kind as a relation between form and content, which then requires "some version of the analogy of being" (5) in order to explain the possibility of such a relation. Adkins and Hinlicky's major objection to such appeals is that they invariably result in "an apophatic account of religion" (62): since a relation of resemblance, such as that between creature and Creator, is necessarily inexact and incomplete, analogical reasoning is unable to positively specify either how the terms differ or what they share precisely as a basis for comparison. God thus remains ineffable and unthought.

To avoid what the authors see as a dead end for both philosophy and theology, they propose instead to 'reinstate' the continuity thesis. Hence the central role of Deleuze: the hylomorphic, analogical formulation of metaphysical dualism will give way to a metaphysics of immanence, which entails cosmological hylozoism (self-organizing matter) and ontological univocity (where 'being' is said in one and the same sense of all that is, whether creator or created). The conceptual starting point for this reversal is to substitute difference in degree for difference in kind, and a particularly pertinent example is the very difference between immanence and transcendence. On the model of discontinuity, the boundary between these two terms is unbridgeable, and what lies on the far side of the divide (transcendence) remains unknowable in principle. By contrast, the continuity thesis will require that both philosophy and theology conceive of 'transcendence within immanence,' a phrase which serves as a leitmotif running throughout the book. In other words, "transcendence and immanence must be seen as two abstract poles on a single continuum" (5), and therefore as opposite directional tendencies that are different in degree rather than different in kind.

Now, it is not clear that this appeal to transcendence within immanence is consistent with Deleuze. Daniel Smith, for example, has contrasted Deleuze and Derrida on just this point, arguing that "in Deleuze one finds an ontology that seeks to expunge from Being all remnants of transcendence, whereas in Derrida one finds an ontology that seeks to trace the eruptions and movements of transcendence within Being."[1] Further, even if it is true that conceiving immanence and transcendence as polar tendencies in a common continuum comports with Deleuze, transcendence itself remains for Deleuze an illusion. The effects of positing transcendence as a supplementary dimension to the plane of immanence are real enough, and religious faith can be evaluated in immanent terms based on the kind of life such faith makes possible; but what is itself posited as transcendent, e.g., God, is metaphysically illusory. Thus, the theological appeal that Adkins and Hinlicky make to transcendence within immanence in the second half of their book -- namely, as the divine event of Incarnation (Deus incarnatus), and as the Advent achieved through the connective force of Spirit in forming the Beloved Community (Deus revelatus) -- would seem to be inconsistent with Deleuzian metaphysics.

The authors may well be comfortable taking their leave of Deleuze here, for they readily admit that "what Deleuze means by 'God' and what Paul means by 'God' are by no means commensurate" (189). After all, they do not promise a Deleuzian theology, but a theology that takes Deleuze's affirmation of the continuity thesis as its starting point. They might, in turn, argue that when Deleuze rejects God as a transcendent illusion, he has in mind precisely an otherworldly notion of the divine, inherited from Nietzsche's critique of Christianity as 'Platonism for the people.' By contrast, Adkins and Hinlicky's account of theological subjectivity as Pauline 'disruptive grace' -- that is, the evental moment of conversion when the "news of the cross of the Messiah," announced in the paradoxical metaphor 'Christ crucified,' "effects in the theological subject a practical and existentially concrete, not a speculative and metaphysically abstract, knowledge of the power, wisdom and love of God" (154) -- offers a compelling ethico-political view of Christian faith that would be grounded entirely in this world. Such a view may in fact have a greater resonance with Deleuze than first appears, for not only is it founded in its commitment to 'subversive' struggle against "the epoch of political sovereignty into which we have fallen" (158), but further, it gives voice to a "theology that intends the intensification of immanence as the way of life that is discipleship" (184).

However, there may be a deeper problem with the way Adkins and Hinlicky have appropriated Deleuze in order to answer "the very question that concerns this book, what is the relation between philosophy and religion, between faith and reason" (46). I would suggest that, from a Deleuzian perspective, the authors have misconstrued this relation and understated the conflict between philosophy and religion. To see how will require taking a closer look at their formulation of each.

Adkins and Hinlicky argue that when reframed through the continuity thesis, philosophy and religion are best understood "rhizomatically" as Deleuzian assemblages (216), which they define as "a singular and temporary coagulation of heterogeneous forces that achieves consistency" (2). More specifically, the authors propose to conceive of philosophy and religion as "refrains," borrowing Deleuze and Guattari's concept from A Thousand Plateaus. Like the song a child sings to herself when left alone in the dark, keeping the forces of chaos at bay by composing an affective territory in which to take shelter, a refrain is defined as "the process by which affects get captured and stabilized into territories and assemblages" (86). A refrain, then, is an assembling of affective forces by which a "territory is formed out of chaos but remains in chaos" (84). Religion and philosophy are refrains insofar as each is a specific manner of capturing affects in response to chaos. Because religion tends toward transcendence while philosophy tends toward immanence, the religion refrain "captures affects such that they are directed toward some 'supplementary dimension,' which takes on a transcendent or transcendental relation to what is stabilized," whereas the philosophy refrain "opens in the direction of the plane of . . . immanence" (86-7).

Now, it is essential for Adkins and Hinlicky that philosophy not be privileged over religion, since a principle aim of the book is to deny the traditional subordination of theology to philosophy. That is, as a way of relating to chaos, the philosophy refrain's orientation toward immanence is argued to be neither better nor worse than the religion refrain's orientation toward transcendence. The authors are indeed at pains to stress that this is also Deleuze's view:

Religion, in contrast to philosophy, takes up the need to be protected from chaos and responds to it by creating something stable, something immune to chaos. . . . Deleuze and Guattari are not claiming that this is a bad or inadequate response to chaos. . . . Deleuze and Guattari are not arguing that immanence is good and transcendence is bad. . . . If Deleuze and Guattari seem to privilege one tendency over another, it is not because of some latent romanticism by which they hope to invert traditional hierarchies, but because for the most part the tendency toward immanence has been little recognized and usually subordinated to some transcendence. It is only in this sense that philosophy, theology, and religion are in conflict. (94-5)

Thus, the authors argue that any conflict between religion and philosophy, or between transcendence and immanence, derives merely from the misguided attempt to subordinate one to the other. Further, likening the opposition between religion and philosophy to that between East and West, i.e., as "two abstract poles of directionality," they contend that "even if the conflict is real, it is not possible for one side to vanquish the other, any more than it is possible for one directional tendency to eliminate another" (95). Of course, on the analogy with cardinal directions, it is unclear how a real conflict would obtain at all since, whatever mutual exclusivity they entail, East and West remain ultimately indifferent to each other.

For Deleuze, however, philosophy does not remain indifferent to religion, but wages its deepest struggle against it. Indeed, the basis for this conflict is precisely the different ways in which philosophy and religion respond to chaos. On Deleuze and Guattari's view, religion falls on the side of opinion, which attempts to act as a bulwark against chaos by enclosing itself from it entirely. Drawing from D.H. Lawrence's image of a protective umbrella, to which Adkins and Hinlicky also refer, Deleuze and Guattari write that "opinion" is

like a sort of "umbrella," which protects us from chaos. . . . But art, science, and philosophy require more: they cast planes over the chaos. These three disciplines are not like religions that invoke dynasties of gods, or the epiphany of a single god, in order to paint a firmament on the umbrella, like the figures of an Urdoxa from which opinions stem. Philosophy, science, and art want us to tear open the firmament and plunge into the chaos.[2]

Adkins and Hinlicky are correct to caution that Deleuze does not advocate a kind of romantic abyssal abandonment, for "it is not the case that philosophy, art, or science simply removes the umbrella. We cannot exist in pure chaos. Rather, we make small slits in our protective barrier in order to let a small bit of chaos in" (93). Indeed, what art, science, and philosophy are able to achieve through their confrontation with chaos, "advanc[ing] by crises or shocks,"[3] is the creation of something new: percepts and affects, in the case of art; functions and propositions, in the case of science; and concepts, in the case of philosophy. Such creative force requires an open if prudentially constrained relationship with chaos. Adkins and Hinlicky in fact recognize this exigency for philosophy, noting that "the possibility of creating something new lies in the direction of immanence," and that "it is only by experimenting with chaos that we can hope to create something new" (95). However, this is precisely what religion, as a form of opinion, cannot achieve, since it seals off chaos behind the 'firmament' of faith.

We thus have good reason for concluding that Deleuze affirms the philosophical way of immanence over the religious way of transcendence: since the production of the new is a fundamental evaluative criterion for Deleuze[4]; since openly engaging chaos is a necessary condition for such production; and since the chief difference between philosophy and religion as refrains is that the former engages chaos whereas the latter does not; it follows that philosophy would be privileged over religion as a form of thought. Indeed, we might even infer that religion, for Deleuze, is not properly a form of thought at all, for "what would thinking be if it did not constantly confront chaos?"[5]

Further, although it is true that Deleuze and Guattari depict philosophy as combatting chaos, this is a preliminary skirmish that prepares philosophy for "a more profound struggle"[6]: namely, that waged against opinion. Speaking of philosophy, art, and science, Deleuze and Guattari write that "it is as if the struggle against chaos does not take place without an affinity with the enemy, because another struggle develops and takes on more importance -- the struggle against opinion, which claims to protect us from chaos itself."[7] Like art and science, philosophy confronts chaos in order to "borrow weapons from it that it turns against opinion, the better to defeat it with tried and tested arms."[8] Therefore, not only does philosophy's relation to chaos afford it a creative power that religion lacks; further, philosophy pursues this potentially dangerous relation precisely as a means of combatting opinion in all its forms, including religion. This, for Deleuze, is the 'real conflict' between philosophy and religion. The new cartography that Adkins and Hinlicky map between religious and philosophical thought would thus seem to underestimate what is at stake in their oppositional relation, at least from a Deleuzian perspective.

Nevertheless, their book is stimulating and recommended reading, both for its systematic critique of the legacy bequeathed to philosophy and theology by Kant, as well as its lively and challenging articulation of a kataphatic Christian theology for the 21st century. Insofar as they have made experimental use of Deleuze's thought to create something new, Adkins and Hinlicky's book no doubt achieves consistency with the spirit of Deleuze.

[1] Daniel W. Smith, "Deleuze and Derrida, Immanence and Transcendence: Two Direction in Recent French Thought," Essays on Deleuze (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2012), 279.

[2] Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy?, translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchill (New York: Verso, 1994), 202, my emphasis.

[3] Ibid., 203.

[4] Adkins and Hinlicky themselves quote Deleuze on Leibniz to this effect: "The best of all worlds is not the one that reproduces the eternal, but the one in which new creations are produced, the one endowed with capacity for innovation and creation" (Deleuze, The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque, translated by Tom Conley (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1993), 79; cited in Adkins and Hinlicky, 169). The same view holds for Deleuze.

[5] Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy?, 208; cf. the "fundamental encounter" that is necessary for thought in Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 139.

[6] Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy?, 206.

[7] Ibid., 203.

[8] Ibid., 204.