Rethinking Punishment

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Leo Zaibert, Rethinking Punishment, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 265pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316645390.

Reviewed by Mitchell N. Berman, University of Pennsylvania


The central question in the philosophy of criminal law concerns the justification of punishment. Roughly: what, if anything, can justify the state's intentional infliction of suffering on (supposed) wrongdoers? Leo Zaibert offers an answer. The short version: the state has (some) reason to promote value; and suffering, when deserved, is valuable.[1] It's valuable because value inheres in Moorean organic unities (or wholes), and because the organic whole that includes A's wrongdoing and A's suffering for it (what I'll call a "retributive organic whole") is more valuable than the organic whole that includes A's wrongdoing but not A's suffering for it.

The merits of the view aside, this is an answer to what has long been deemed the discipline's fundamental question; it is not a "rethinking." Zaibert's claimed rethinking concerns the route he takes to reach his answer. Starting from the orthodox premise that the field's central dividing line pits consequentialists against retributivists, Zaibert's proposed rethinking comprises two critical steps. First, retributivism should be reconceived as an axiological doctrine (a doctrine about value), not -- as theorists have traditionally viewed it -- as a deontic doctrine (a doctrine about what we ought to do). Second, once we're thinking axiologically, we should abandon the value monism that punishment theorists overwhelmingly prefer in favor of value pluralism. If punishment theorists (1) rethink retributivism as centrally about value, and (2) rethink our axiologies as pluralistic, rather than monistic, then the case for retributivism is nearly sealed, for (3) it should be clear that an axiological pluralism that recognizes retributive organic wholes is superior to one that excludes them. We see this by reflecting on the usual sorts of cases and two-world hypotheticals, and on the value of forgiveness or mercy.

There's much here to admire, especially the scope and richness of the authors and materials Zaibert explores. And much, I think, to agree with. Regrettably, though, the book suffers from one deep flaw: neither of the two moves he advocates is nearly as new as he represents. Many retributivists already view their disagreement with anti-retributivists as turning upon a contested claim about value; and most punishment theorists of any stripe already endorse value pluralism.

This flaw is costly. Despite my considerable sympathy for pluralistic axiological retributivism, I anticipate that skeptics will find the argumentation for that view somewhat thin. I suspect that neither non-axiological retributivists (theorists who justify punishment in terms of a wrongdoer's desert, but not as a means to promote value) nor axiological anti-retributivists (value pluralists who deny that suffering is good even if or when deserved) will find their concerns adequately addressed. While admirably wide-ranging and frequently incisive, this book would have been more valuable, I think, had Zaibert expended less energy introducing pluralistic axiological retributivism to a supposedly innocent or hostile contemporary theory community, and more energy making the case for it.

The book contains eight chapters, plus an appendix. Here's a summary. Chapter 1 is an introduction and overview that advances the two key moves that together add up to Zaibert's recommended rethinking. First, proposing to reverse common wisdom, Zaibert argues that retributivism "should be seen as an axiological doctrine, not a deontic one." (14) Second, by recognizing that the central debate is between competing axiologies, we are in position also to "recognize that the central distinction is in fact that which opposes monistic and pluralistic justifications of punishment," for whereas "both consequentialism and deontic retributivism are simplemindedly monistic," (18) axiological retributivism is fairly obviously pluralistic: nobody thinks that giving wrongdoers the suffering they deserve is the only thing of value. This is the key insight: to better justify punishment, "what matters most is the pluralism with which axiological retributivism is consistent." (19)

Chapter 2 "expand[s] on the appeal of a pluralistic axiology," (26) by arguing "that desert ought to figure in any plausible axiology of punishment," (32) and invoking for support G.E. Moore's doctrine of organic wholes (or "unities") -- states or phenomena whose "value is additively independent from the value of their parts." (41) The point of introducing organic wholes is to show that the intrinsic value associated with desert "is not as mysterious as many thinkers have claimed." (44) "The value of desert is the result of it being a form of order, an arrangement, an emplotment." (44-45)

The next three chapters aim to establish that "the vast majority of contemporary punishment theorists fail to embrace [axiological] pluralism." (27) Chapter 3 discusses consequentialist justifications, attending to recent work by T.M. Scanlon and Victor Tadros. Both, Zaibert concludes, "remain (sometimes in spite of their protestations to the contrary) classical utilitarians" -- monistically hedonistic. (27) Chapter 4 tackles retributivism, focusing on Kant and Michael Moore. Kant's retributivism is dismissed as straightforwardly deontic and monist. Moore is more complicated, for he seemed to endorse axiological retributivism twenty-five years ago, when opining that "what is distinctively retributivist is the view that the guilty receiving their just deserts is an intrinsic good."[2] And he has explicitly espoused some form of pluralism ever since.[3] But Zaibert deems that Moore's apparent endorsement of a pluralistic retributive axiology is either insincere or confused, concluding that "other values do not, in Moore's estimation, belong to the problem of the justification of punishment, which in his view, just like in Kant's, is entirely a matter of justice, and justice, in turn, is entirely a matter of giving people what they deserve." (93)

Chapter 5 discusses communicative theories that justify punishment as a means "to get wrongdoers to understand the wrongness of what they have done." (118) Again, Zaibert attends to two thinkers: Antony Duff and John Tasioulas. While recognizing that Duff, the foremost communicative theorist, does emphasize that any punishment theory must account for an "untidy collection of indissolubly conflicting values," (124) Zaibert ends up concluding that Duff's theory is "not properly pluralistic." (132, 133) Tasioulas comes out better. Zaibert lauds Tasioulas for being more pluralistic than Duff (indeed, Zaibert's own doubts about Duff's pluralism expand on challenges that Tasioulas had first raised) and, especially, for so strongly emphasizing the competing values of retributive desert and mercy or forgiveness -- for "understand[ing] that the attempt to justify punishment without considering the value of inflicting deserved punishment in concert with the value of mercifully remitting it is importantly incomplete." (147) Still, Zaibert adjudges Tasioulas's view unsatisfactory because, by positing correlative rights and duties of mercy, it muddies the axiological/deontic distinction and thus fails to take axiological pluralism seriously enough. In sum, Zaibert tells us, these three chapters "show that extant justifications of punishment are indeed monistic and problematically simple-minded." (29)

As Chapter 5 reveals, Zaibert views the tension or conflict between retributive desert and forgiveness as providing critical insight into axiological pluralism -- and into the moral complexity that punishment always and inescapably implicates. Even when justified, he insists, punishment leaves "remainders"; punishers, even when justified, ought to feel guilty. The final three chapters explore this theme at greater depth. Chapter 6 attributes theorists' supposed hostility to pluralism to the facts that pluralism leads to hard and messy problems at the normative bottom line, and that punishment theorists (Alon Harel is the lone example) are mostly beholden to "illusions of tidiness engendered by" a picture of morality that Zaibert calls "moral mathematics." (170-71) Chapter 7 is a long critical analysis of recent work by Martha Nussbaum designed to show that moral philosophers have "perpetuated two flawed views, which have degenerated into veritable myths: first, that forgiveness is at odds with retributivism, and second, that forgiveness is particularly at home within utilitarian worldviews." (179) Chapter 8 examines Herman Melville's great novella Billy Budd, Sailor to illustrate more vividly "the problematic tension between punishment and forgiveness." (210).

If this summary suggests that Zaibert's investigation ranges widely -- from G.E. Moore and Immanuel Kant to Nussbaum and Melville -- that is just the tip of a large iceberg. In an impressive display of learning, Zaibert: motivates the very challenge of justifying punishment by introducing the theodicies ("systematic effort[s] to explain why there is evil in the world" (5)) of Leibniz and Weber; bolsters the plausibility of Moorean organic unities by investigating the thought of the nineteenth century German philosopher, Franz Brentano, and the moral particularism of Jonathan Dancy; marshals P.F. Strawson, Bernard Williams, Isaiah Berlin, Bertrand Russell, and Jon Elster to cause trouble for value monism; and appeals at other junctions to such diverse authorities as Hamlet and the Talmud, Huckleberry Finn and Hannah Arendt, Alexander Pushkin and Jacques Derrida.

Zaibert's engagement with authors rarely discussed in the punishment theory literature is often illuminating. But it comes at a cost: he must devote less attention to current work in the philosophy of criminal law and criminal law theory than he otherwise might. In this case, the cost strikes me as exorbitant. Despite his early assurance that he "will, of course, engage with the work of leading contemporary punishment theorists and philosophers of law," (11) the three chapters that are devoted to the current state of punishment theory consider exactly four living punishment theorists: Moore, Tasioulas, Duff, and Tadros. That is too few. Even if Zaibert were to show that, despite their protestations, none of these four theorists is an axiological pluralist (and I'll raise doubts about this shortly), that wouldn't be remotely sufficient to establish his descriptive claims about the contemporary theory literature. And those claims, in my judgment, are not accurate. Several contemporary punishment theorists -- including Michael Cahill, Doug Husak, and myself -- have been pressing pluralist and axiological retributivist justifications for years.[4] And many other theorists (Thom Brooks, Michael Davis, Mark White, and others) have championed accounts that are explicitly pluralistic, if not resolutely axiological. Zaibert's failure to engage adequately with recent work by criminal law theorists conveys a very misleading picture of the state of the literature.[5]

Ironically, the chief victim of this oversight may be Zaibert himself. As I will explain, there are reasons to doubt both (1) that self-described retributivists who have sought to justify punishment by reference to an offender's desert, but in a non-consequentialist or non-instrumental manner, will be persuaded by the book to embrace the axiological turn; and (2) that many anti-retributivists will be persuaded by the appeal of pluralism to endorse retributive organic wholes. In overestimating the contribution that is made simply by making axiological pluralistic retributivism visible, Zaibert may have simultaneously underestimated the work still needed to make the view persuasive.

Consider non-axiological retributivism first. As I have indicated, I agree with Zaibert that two kinds of retributivism are worth distinguishing: a kind that sees it as essentially about value, and a kind that sees it as essentially about reason or ought. And, like Zaibert, I am disposed to prefer the former view. But Zaibert goes further than I did in purporting to advance "one succinct and straightforward argument . . . why retributivism ought to be seen as essentially axiological." Although "Retributivists can disagree as to the complicated questions concerning the deontic implications of their axiological commitments," he allows, "no retributivist can deny the axiological point that deserved punishment is intrinsically valuable." Thus, "the axiological commitment is revealed as absolutely essential to retributivism in ways that no other commitment is." (14-15)

Given my own attraction to axiological retributivism, I would like this argument to be good. But I do not think that non-axiological retributivists maintain what Zaibert thinks they do. "Deontic retributivists," he says, are "thinkers who believe that because deserved suffering is valuable then it ought to be inflicted." (14) (By "ought," Zaibert means something much stronger than "is a reason that," and closer to "obligation.") I think this gets things backwards. Non-axiological retributivists (including, for example, Leora Dahan Katz, and the late Dan Markel) do not believe that suffering ought to be inflicted because the state of affairs in which a wrongdoer experiences deserved suffering is valuable. Some reject the claim that what wrongdoers deserve is suffering. Rather, they say, wrongdoers deserve a certain treatment or response -- to be punished -- and we are justified in responding in that deserved way. And those who accept suffering as wrongdoers' desert typically reach punishment's justifiability through the compound claim that justice consists in meting out deserts and that we have some obligation to pursue justice, and not via any claims about value. For deontic retributivists, in short, justice and right are prior to the good, not derivative of it. More generally, the fact (if true) that value is best captured by a large plurality of organic wholes does not establish that the universe of reason, ought, and obligation is exhausted by the injunction to promote value. Oddly, then, Zaibert's pluralism is too limited: while championing value pluralism, he appears either resistant or unreceptive to normative pluralism.[6]

Now consider axiological pluralists who reject retributivism. The nutshell worry here is that the supposed truth that deserved suffering is non-instrumentally good does not follow so seamlessly from embrace of value pluralism as Zaibert suggests. Let me be clear: Zaibert's invocation of organic wholes may prove congenial and illuminating to those who harbor axiological retributivist sympathies. But I'm not optimistic that those who don't are likely to be moved. For one thing, Zaibert acknowledges that he has said little (47-48) to defeat the usual objections to organic wholes -- essentially, that the value of any given whole is left to unguided intuition.

Furthermore, it's unclear to me why the book should convert anti-retributivists who are open to organic wholes but deny positive value to retributive organic wholes. Possibly, Zaibert's insightful reflections on the value of forgiveness will advance the ball. As somebody little versed in the forgiveness literature, I'm frankly uncertain (though, again, I wonder at the absence of theorists I had expected to encounter, such as Jean Hampton and Jeffrie Murphy). In places, however, Zaibert appears to place too much stock in the meaning that deserved suffering can contribute to a whole, as though the mere fact that one whole has more meaning than another renders it more valuable. Thus, for example, he argues that "deserved punishment can, other things being equal, be better than impunity . . . because desert gives a certain order -- a certain meaning -- to the whole in which it appears, and this in turn generates intrinsic, non-medicinal [i.e., non-instrumental], value." (43) The whole in which an instructor calls on male students before female students has a meaning that the whole in which an instructor calls on students randomly lacks. But it is not, for that reason, more valuable; presumably, it is less.

Zaibert's case against the non-retributive pluralist may also veer a little close to linguistic legislation. Recall his case against Tadros and Duff. Although both claim the mantle of value pluralism, Zaibert dismisses them as "not fully monistic" only "formally speaking," (73) and as not "properly pluralistic." (133) "To be seen as pluralists in my sense," he explains, it's not enough that one recognize a plurality of values. One must also believe that deserved suffering is valuable and that the merciful remission of deserved suffering is valuable. (17) This strikes me as tendentious -- rather like defining polytheism as belief in many gods, so long as one of them is Vishnu, and concluding that, on this basis, the ancient Egyptians weren't properly polytheistic. Zaibert views things differently; he thinks that the failure to appreciate the value of forgiveness and its dilemmatic relationship to the value of punishment is to overlook or deny, not simply another value or two, but something like an entire dimension of value. Although I am unpersuaded that this is a fruitful way to think about value pluralism, Zaibert is entitled to his stipulations. But a novel and counterintuitive stipulated definition of a common term is bound to breed confusion that an author must be careful not to exploit, and Zaibert isn't quite careful enough. Take his conclusion that "it is in not being properly pluralistic that Duff's position can be seen as monistic." (133) More accurate, I think, is that Duff's position is pluralistic but does not endorse the particular values that Zaibert thinks it should. Ditto for Tadros. Zaibert notes early on that "The retributivist asserts that deserved punishment is intrinsically valuable, and the consequentialist denies it." (15) This is a point on which many contemporary theorists are agreed. What is needed are more arguments that bear on this question, and not on the logically upstream dispute between monists and pluralists.

What would good arguments for the value of deserved suffering look like? What anti-retributivists might most want are arguments responsive to determinism. How does negative desert, or the goodness of retributive organic wholes, make moral sense if wrongdoers could not have willed otherwise? What anti-retributivists might not want, but retributivists should nonetheless be keen to supply, are arguments that turn tables on anti-retributivists by making clearer the difficulties that arise at every jumping-off point on the path toward retributive desert -- from the denial that anybody can ever deserve anything in any sense of desert that is not morally inert, to the acceptance of 'positive desert' but not 'negative desert,' to the acceptance of a form of negative desert that categorically rules out that deserved suffering can be good. Zaibert does not pursue the first line of inquiry, regarding determinism. He does address the second, in the appendix, where he subjects Derek Parfit's anti-retributivism in On What Matters II to fierce criticism, much of it penetrating. Readers well versed in contemporary punishment theory might wish that the appendix weren't only an appendix.[7]

[1] The first premise lies mostly offstage because here, as in his previous work, Zaibert is interested in punishment generally, not only punishment inflicted by the state. See Leo Zaibert, Punishment and Retribution (Ashgate, 2006). Still, the premise is needed if the account is to justify criminal punishment.

[2] Michael S. Moore, "Justifying Retributivism," Israel Law Review 27 (1993): 15-49, 19.

[3] Most recently in Michael S. Moore, "Responses and Appreciations," in Kimberly Kessler Ferzan and Stephen J. Morse (eds.) Legal, Moral and Metaphysical Truths: The Philosophy of Michael S. Moore (Oxford University Press, 2016): 343-425, 344-48.

[4] See, for example, Douglas Husak, "Why Punish the Deserving?," Nous 26 (1992): 447-64; Michael T. Cahill, "Punishment Pluralism," in Mark D. White (ed.) Retributivism: Essays on Theory and Policy (Oxford University Press 2011): 25-48; Michael T. Cahill, "Retributive Justice in the Real World," Washington University Law Review 85 (2007): 815-70; Mitchell N. Berman, "Punishment and Justification," Ethics 118 (2008): 258-90; Mitchell N. Berman, "Two Kinds of Retributivism," in R.A. Duff and Stuart P. Green (eds.) Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law (Oxford University Press 2011): 433-57.

[5] More generally, I worry about Zaibert's penchant to make extravagant claims about the state of criminal law theory -- "contemporary punishment theory is unable to cope with the complexity of moral thought and moral life" (2); it is "virtually universally accepted" that no moral cost remains when punishment is "justified" (3); the difference between axiological and deontic considerations is "typically overlooked by contemporary punishment theorists" (4, 26); it is a "firmly entrenched misconception in punishment theory . . . that desert . . . is essentially a Kantian motif" (26); etc. These claims are not substantiated, and I find each doubtful.

[6] Not incidentally, I think the partial character of Zaibert's pluralism infects his treatment of Michael Moore's retributivism. According to Zaibert, Moore "partitions the axiological space in such a way" that, while recognizing that deserved suffering (or punishment) is not the only value, thinks it's only a "happy surplus" for retributivists, who view the giving of justice as "the intrinsic good that it is the function of criminal law to bring about." (93) Zaibert has grounds to be critical of Moore; I have expressed some similar concerns myself. Mitchell N. Berman, "Modest Retributivism," in Legal, Moral, and Metaphysical Truths: 35-47. But if Moore ends up looking insufficiently pluralist, it's not the consequence of his partitioning of axiological space. It's the product of a particular functionalist analysis of the criminal law -- one that is argued for at some length, not "baldly posit[ed]." (92)

[7] I am grateful to Leo Zaibert for helpful conversations and comments on a previous draft, and to participants at a workshop held at Rutgers Law School, Newark for discussions about the book.