Rethinking Race: The Case for Deflationary Realism

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Michael O. Hardimon, Rethinking Race: The Case for Deflationary Realism, Harvard University Press, 2017, 226pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674975668.

Reviewed by Robin Zheng, Yale-NUS College


Back in 2011, a petition was launched urging the Philosophical Gourmet Report (PGR) to include Philosophy of Race as a specialty, in view of its being a "vibrant and important area of research" that "deserves full recognition [and] professional legitimacy." Seven years later, my latest search on PhilJobs turned up 22 faculty positions explicitly mentioning race in their preferred AOS or AOC, and, for what it's worth, Philosophy of Race is indeed a category of the PGR. There should be little question now of the vibrancy, importance, and legitimacy of philosophical debates over how to understand and deal with race. Michael Hardimon's new book is the latest and welcome addition to the social ontological fray.

Hardimon's immediate target is eliminativism about race, that is, the view that we should eliminate 'race' from our ontology and our vocabulary, because races do not exist and race talk is morally pernicious. His ultimate aim is no less than providing a clear and comprehensive answer to the basic metaphysical question, 'What is race?'. Hardimon's biggest service to the field is introducing a tight package of four concepts that will enable us definitively to "think and speak coherently about race" (3). They are as follows:

Racialist race is the familiar and pernicious concept of races as groups of human beings that possess distinct biological essences, resulting in intellectual and characterological differences that mark some race(s) as superior to others.

Hardimon concurs with eliminativists that the concept racialist race does not refer to anything that actually exists in the world. However, he thinks we need to keep the word 'race' because it can also refer to a very different concept:

Minimalist race is the (also familiar but non-pernicious) concept of races as groups of human beings distinguishable by visible physical traits that signal differences in geographical ancestry.

Unlike racialist races, minimalist races are real, and can be understood scientifically. According to Hardimon, minimalist race is really the ordinary concept of race.

Now, just as H2 is the scientific concept that corresponds to our ordinary concept of water and refers to molecules composed of two hydrogen atoms and an oxygen atom, so too there is a scientific concept corresponding to our ordinary concept of minimalist race that refers (most likely) to biologically distinctive populations. It adds crucial biological notions that are not present in the ordinary concept:

Populationist race is the concept of races as groups of human beings whose visible physical differences are genetically transmitted and indicative of distinct founding populations that were once reproductively isolated from one another due to geographical separation.

Finally, Hardimon proposes that we reserve an entirely different concept altogether in order to account for the social (rather than biological) reality of race:

Socialrace is the concept of races as groups of human beings who have, as a matter of contingent sociohistorical fact, been mistakenly taken to be racialist races.

As the foregoing suggests, the book is very much an exercise in good old-fashioned philosophical ground-clearing par excellence. In this Hardimon succeeds exceptionally well. The book is extremely clear, almost punishingly so. Every workmanlike chapter begins with a painstaking overview of what each section and/or sub-section will do; each section, sub-section, sub-sub-section, and sub-sub-sub-subsection handily does its job (sometimes in a mere paragraph or two); and every conclusion tersely reiterates what has been done. At times it reads like an outline that has only just been massaged into the absolute barest minimum of prose sentences. For this reason I would hesitate to recommend the book for inexperienced philosophy students.

Instead, the book would be appropriate for advanced students with some familiarity with the subject, and it is an essential read for all metaphysicians of race, as well as any philosophers seeking an introduction to the area whose tastes lean toward desert landscapes. The book is lucid, compelling, and, I repeat, does a great service. To be sure, others in the business draw distinctions between race concepts all the time, in the service of building their arguments. But Hardimon has devoted himself explicitly to the project of clarifying and "cleaning up" concepts to make them more expedient for ordinary and scientific use. It is as though he has waded into the conceptual weeds, revved up a heavy-duty brush cutter, and razed it all to the ground before erecting the most exacting and austere of lawn borders: leaving our pathways of thought impeccably straight, narrow, and true.

The chief virtue of Hardimon's position is that he makes absolutely clear -- indeed, hits us repeatedly over the head with the fact -- that the word "race" does not refer (only) to the concept racialist race. This is his starting point, and from here he aims to change the way that we think about race, both theoretically and practically.

On the theoretical side, Hardimon ably accomplishes the "detailed analytical work required to arrive at a clear and perspicuous view" (2), which he calls deflationary realism. The view is realist because it asserts that minimalist races are biologically real and socialraces are socially real, and moreover that populationist races may be real. But it is deflationary because being 'real' need not amount to very much, biologically speaking. The case for deflationary realism unfolds in a highly logical manner.

Chapter 1 provides a highly abbreviated summary of classic eliminativist arguments. Hardimon stresses how important it is to retain racialist race for the purposes of refutation, because of its enormous role in the world-historical development of the modern social world and its lingering power. He writes: "If there is one thing people ought to know about race, it is that there are no racialist races" (15).

Chapter 2, which builds from Hardimon's article "The Ordinary Concept of Race," sets up deflationary realism by introducing minimalist race. A key move here is invoking the well-known distinction between concept and conception. Hardimon concedes that ordinary people (consciously or non-consciously) buy into racialist conceptions of race, but contends that the race concept they use -- which they share with non-racialist users -- does not include any of these assumptions at its "logical core" (28). At its core, race requires only 1) groups of humans distinguishable by patterns of visible physical features, which 2) indicate a common ancestry, that 3) is associated with a distinct geographical origin. Hardimon defends this view against some hard cases and objections, but I imagine that many if not most competent users will find it so unproblematic as to be obvious. Thus Chapter 3, which establishes the existence of minimalist races, is quick and dirty. (Even Appiah doesn't deny it, as Hardimon plays up in a sub-section cheekily, if chunkily, titled "Guess Who Allows the Existence of Minimalist Race?".)

Chapter 4 gets into the meat of deflationary realism. The crucial idea is that biological reality doesn't entail biological significance. What our bodies physically look like is genetically grounded and, as such, is a real matter of biology. But grouping people according to what they look like is as superficial and insignificant as it sounds: it does not signal anything 'deeper' about differences in normatively important traits, anatomical functioning, or evolutionary lineage. In their earnest desire to wrest away any scientific basis for racism, Hardimon implies, scholars have been over-zealous in refusing to confer the honorific "real" on any biological property. But rethinking race in deflationary realist terms means "freeing ourselves" (97) from the corner where we have been backed into implausibly denying the real -- though insignificant -- biological basis of racial difference.

Chapters 5 and 6 develop the concept of populationist race, the "scientized" correlate of the ordinary concept (113). Here, Hardimon aims to anchor the elements of minimalist race within a biologically respectable framework -- without tying in more substantial concepts such as species, lineage, or phylogeny. Against the objection that races are disappearing because they are no longer geographically isolated, he argues that there are still social barriers to reproduction, and hence races will continue to be biologically interesting populations.

Chapter 7 is a basically untouched version of Hardimon's article "The Concept of Socialrace." Socialrace is an unabashedly political, emancipatory concept: it refers to groups of people who have been wrongly, unjustly treated as something they are not. Indeed, properly speaking, it is socialraces that have been socially constructed. Hardimon distinguishes socialrace as a phenomenon -- the social-structural system of norms, practices, and institutions through which a society treats people as if they were members of racialist races -- from socialrace, a concept which has not been recognized in its own right. The former has been well-studied and denounced, but it has generally been referred to with the word "race," which, we know, ordinarily refers instead to minimalist race. While Hardimon is well aware that "socialrace" is an ugly neologism, he argues that we need a distinct concept that "wears its sociality on its sleeve" (141) and thereby trains our attention on the social construction of purported racialist races. Note that socialrace cannot be construed as a conception of minimalist race, because the former depends on our social practices, norms, and beliefs while the latter -- our actual physical differences -- is independent of anything we do.

Chapter 8, finally, takes on a major topic wherein the philosophy of science of race hits the road. At this point we see how serviceable these concepts really are: they enable Hardimon to easily defend clear and reasonable positions on the medical relevance of race. Hardimon advocates using socialrace to study the deleterious impacts of racism on health outcomes and populationist race to study genetic differences, acknowledging that the former is much more likely to be fruitful.

Moving now to the practical side of things: Hardimon proclaims forcefully that our metaphysical views matter politically because antiracism should not rest on a philosophical falsehood, i.e. eliminativism. But unfortunately, though he opens the book by alluding to the "practical urgency [given] to the metaphysical question" (2), even claiming that "doing this work is vital because of the practical importance of race" (2), Hardimon never quite delivers this practical upshot, i.e. he neglects to fully demonstrate the implications of his deflationary realist metaphysics for antiracist politics.

Still, I suspect he has a point. The idea that 'Race is a social construct', i.e. using "race" to mean socialrace, has gained increasingly wide currency in mainstream discourse -- but also, predictably, some reactionary derision. At my alma mater (whose surrounding town, boasting the legacies of Robert E. Lee and Stonewall Jackson, was most recently in the news for Sarah Huckabee Sanders's failed attempt to dine there), the mandatory first-year orientation included a documentary whose bottom line was the oft-heard finding that genetic variation is greater within than across races. My only remaining memory of the ensuing town hall-style discussion was that it morphed into a debate over whether a student should be permitted to hang a Confederate flag outside his window. Years later, as a graduate student, I taught a mini-unit on philosophy of race. I began by asking how many races there are; but to my embarrassment, my students refused to name the standard 4-5 that would have set me up to debunk the 'commonsense view' as planned. When I explained that there are black, white, yellow, red (and maybe brown) races, they asked about Indians and Arabs. I was put into the awkward position of having to teach them both the 'commonsense' beliefs they should have had, and also why they shouldn't have had them.

The reason for delving into these autobiographical minutiae is to highlight the gap that has emerged between well-intentioned scholarly work that seeks to consecrate antiracism with (what at least used to be) the halo of incontrovertible scientific authority, on the one hand, and the ways that ordinary people think about race, on the other. This scholarly tradition (perhaps best exemplified by the 1998 American Anthropological Association's Statement on Race, in which every use of the words "race" and "racial" is pointedly quarantined within scare-quotes), has played an immensely valuable role in the historical battle against racism. But the triumphant overturning of 'race' via science, as Hardimon makes clear, depends on fairly robust assumptions to which many people simply are no longer committed: that racial groups possess distinctive essences found in all and only their members, that there are sharp distinctions between races, or that genetic variation must be greater between than within races. For the ordinary person, the existence of race is plainly written on our faces, literally -- whether or not the rest holds true. I find it credible that the ordinary concept in play between competent users really is minimalist race.

Thus, to deny, or appear to deny, that people from different parts of the world are distinguishable by patterns of skin color, hair texture, nose shape, etc. is to deny something that ordinary people take to be as plain as day. This means that well-motivated claims to the effect that race 'isn't real' or 'is only a social construct' can be exploited for unscrupulous ends, as further fuel on the fire of rage against elites who are out of touch with reality, so-called political correctness gone amok, and so on -- much of which, we know, is thinly disguised racialist resentment. Hardimon's taxonomy unambiguously slices away the social from the biological, forcing us to acknowledge that (minimalist) race is not socially constructed (though socialraces are).

At the end of the day, however, there remains much work to be done in harnessing metaphysics for politics. Is "socialrace" really going to catch on, as Hardimon optimistically notes it could? Can we really talk about minimalist race without racialist race sneaking in the back door? One reason the phenomenon of socialrace is so entrenched is precisely because people who are talking about racialist race scurry under fire to the excuse that they only mean minimalist race, e.g. when racial fetishes are defended as pure, harmless physical attraction rather than susceptibility to racial stereotypes. Hardimon, in my view, is too glib about this -- that race is indeed metaphysically non-malefic doesn't mean that it won't, out in the world, inevitably be used for malefic ends (a concern he acknowledges but does not adequately dispel). Moreover, the four-part conceptual machinery needed to maintain its non-maleficence is really quite hefty, though I am persuaded it is necessary. In the absence of quality philosophical training for all, would it be better to keep peddling the simpler story, i.e., to reclaim or appropriate the word "race" for socialrace? But then again, as I described earlier, this strategy also comes with sizeable pitfalls.

These are the questions we are left with. I am unsure if we will come up with suitable answers soon, or if it matters whether philosophers do at all. The surest way of changing the way we use words is to change the world. But I do think that we philosophers would do well to consider taking up Hardimon's eminently serviceable new toolbox of concepts.