Rethinking Responsibility

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K. E. Boxer, Rethinking Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2013, 176pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695324.

Reviewed by Matt King, UCLA School of Law


Karin Boxer injects a fresh perspective on what has become to some a stale dialectic regarding free will and moral responsibility. The book is billed as the result of an incompatibilist's search for the best defense of her position, only to become dissatisfied with the arguments, and left with the conclusion that "moral guilt, blame, responsibility, and obligation are compatible with determinism" (161). But despite its advertised conclusion, it would be a mistake to treat the book as merely a critique of incompatibilism. It is more than that. While presenting its central challenge, it also puts forth intriguing arguments about the nature of obligation, desert, and punishment.

In sketch form, the book's main argument goes something like this. First, assume that causal determinism is incompatible with ultimate responsibility (i.e., with our being responsible for the distant causes of our actions). Given this incompatibility, Boxer thinks the best strategy going forward for incompatiblists will be in showing moral responsibility to require ultimate responsibility. If it can be shown that moral responsibility does not in fact require ultimate responsibility, incompatibilism is undermined. The aim of the book, then, is to show that ultimate responsibility is not required for moral responsibility.

I cannot do full justice to the range of issues and subtleties of argument and reply that Boxer considers throughout the book. Instead, I'll give an all too brief sketch of its contents, and then comment on the positive contributions I find most intriguing.

Chapter 1 argues that current incompatibilist defenses of ultimate responsibility as a precondition for moral responsibility are unpersuasive. The conclusion of the chapter is that incompatibilists have not yet made the case for ultimate responsibility being required, and so they face a challenge to provide one. The principal move in this chapter is drawing a necessary distinction between being "full-fledgedly deserving of moral blame for an action" and "being, or being responsible for, the action's ultimate cause(s)" (18). Boxer believes it is far too easy to slide from talk of moral responsibility to talk of ultimate responsibility, essentially conflating the two. But, of course, since compatibilists will, and ought to, reject ultimate responsibility, to conflate it with moral responsibility is to beg the question against them. And Boxer demonstrates nicely how a number of prominent discussions (e.g., Galen Strawson's 'Basic Argument'; Pereboom's '4-Case Argument') fail to adequately distinguish between the two terms.

Finding extant arguments unsatisfactory on this score, Boxer proceeds by considering ways in which a requirement of ultimate responsibility might be motivated. Chapters 2 and 3 consider whether desert of blame might require ultimate responsibility on two understandings of blame. The first is as an appraisal of the wrongdoer as morally faulty. To morally blame an agent for some action is to judge that the action reflects a defect of that agent's character. Boxer argues that the moral force of such appraisals does not require ultimate responsibility; it only requires that the agent violated an unconditional obligation to eliminate her defects of character. Moreover, these obligations themselves do not require the falsity of determinism, only they only require that we are normal adult human beings with the usual human capacities for general moral reasoning.

The second understanding, following P.F. Strawson, takes blame to be constituted by the reactive attitudes, like resentment and moral reprobation. Boxer argues that deserving such attitudes also does not require ultimate responsibility. Desert of the attitudes is "fully and independently" determined "by their own internal standards of appropriateness," which also are not threatened by the thesis of determinism (66). Since none of the excusing or exempting conditions recognized by those internal standards would generally hold if determinism were true, ultimate responsibility is not required to deserve the negative reactive moral attitudes.

Boxer then turns in Chapters 4 and 5 to an extended discussion of the relevance of punishment to deserving the negative moral reactive attitudes. The thought is that perhaps deserved punishment requires ultimate responsibility. But despite the intuitive appeal of the idea that a person could only deserve punishment if ultimately responsible for some wrong, Boxer concludes (in Chapter 4) that the best understanding of punishment is in terms of communicating our moral rejection of the conduct in question and (in Chapter 5) that such a communicative theory of punishment is not committed to ultimate responsibility being required for deserved punishment.

There is much that is worth discussing in Boxer's book, and I certainly cannot do justice to the full range of issues raised. Instead, I'll focus mainly on her discussion of punishment. The role of punishment does a lot of work for the view Boxer defends. While she makes a number of notable claims regarding punishment, among the most noteworthy is that punishment is an integral component of blame (though not all blame). She insists that it is "built into our ordinary understanding of moral responsibility" that perpetrators of serious wrongdoing "deserve not just blame, but punishment" and that an account of moral responsibility "that does not speak to such desert will . . . be deflationary or . . . incomplete" (91).

I find this suggestion a bit odd. While I would readily accept that it is part of our ordinary understanding of punishment that, if it is deserved, it is deserved only by those who are morally responsible, I would resist building into the very concept of responsibility any entailment regarding punishment. It seems perfectly consistent to think that people deserve blame and praise but that no one deserves punishment (on independent moral reasons). Even if she's right in insisting that incompatibilists will be more likely to think there is a strong conceptual connection between being morally responsible and deserving punishment, such a tendency is arguably called into question by Boxer's own observations, which opened the book. If incompatibilists (and those with incompatibilist intuitions) are apt to slide from talk of moral responsibility to talk of ultimate responsibility, then thinking that moral responsibility implies deserved punishment may in fact really amount to thinking that ultimate responsibility implies deserved punishment.

Setting aside what may or may not belong to our ordinary thought, I want to turn to spelling out (part of) Boxer's own view. On her account, punishment is required to adequately communicate the moral reprobation wrongdoers deserve, desert of which gives us positive reason to give it to them. This necessity comes as a result of our needing to show wrongdoers that we oppose their violation of an obligation for basic regard of others, and when we cannot do this in anticipation of a wrong, we must retroactively oppose the agent's unacceptable behavior, "deliberately imposing on her a loss she would not ordinarily willingly incur" (128). In short, we must punish to show we do not and will not tolerate such violations. But, as Boxer makes plain earlier in the book, the "we" involved refers to all those in the moral community, which is just the community of moral agents. Thus, we have positive reason to punish all those moral agents who violate the demand for basic regard.

I have some concerns about this proposal. First, one of Boxer's concessions is that incompatibilists might motivate the need for ultimate responsibility if punishment were essentially non-communicative, such that those that deserved it deserved suffering simpliciter. She holds that such a view is morally unattractive, and therefore would amount to a bullet to bite. But it's unclear why the communicative view she offers is really any more defensible. I'm hard pressed to see why intentionally inflicting harms on another is the only way to show that I will not tolerate their violation of obligation. It does not seem far-fetched to think that we might hold others accountable without resorting to treatments that resemble punishment. Boxer criticizes the basic retributive view of punishment as suffering simpliciter for amounting to no more than 'tit for tat'; but the infliction of harm looks to be the only thing missing from a public and strongly delivered message of rebuke and reassertion of our shared moral norms, and the communicative purpose of punishment on Boxer's view. If it is the infliction of harm that makes the difference between punishment serving its necessary ends and failing to do so, we might think that the 'tit for tat' complaint applies to Boxer's view as well.

But this criticism notwithstanding, I have a separate concern regarding the implications of Boxer's communicative account of deserved punishment. Compare it with a different view, what we might call an institutional account of punishment. On such a view, punishment is a response made fitting, in part, by institutional structures and rules, which, among other things, empower the punisher to inflict harm legitimately on the one punished. Political arrangements may be the clearest examples of how such empowerment works, but it arguably can be found in many institutional arrangements (e.g., sporting leagues). What is notable about punishment on such an account is that the power to punish is exclusively held by some and is jurisdictional in nature. I present this view, not to advocate for it, but so as to put into sharper contrast some worrisome features of Boxer's own account.

Returning, then, to Boxer's view, recall that it is predicated on our needing to punish at least the worst offenders or else we are tolerating their morally unacceptable violation of basic regard. Failure to punish amounts to accepting the wrongdoing. But now consider perpetrators of genocide, female genital mutilation, and all other manner of moral transgressions around the globe. As each of the perpetrators deserves punishment, indeed, since punishment is necessary to properly show our non-toleration, we have positive reason to seek out such individuals to mete out their just deserts. Those of us who think of punishment as, contra Boxer, essentially an institutional practice may balk at political communities having license to punish those outside their own jurisdiction.

Of course, having positive reason to punish them does not imply that we are required to do so. But the other options aren't clearly preferable. If I must punish or else unjustly 'tolerate' some wrongdoing, this generalizes to all other moral agents; they must punish or else tolerate. But we cannot all punish without giving the offender far more than she deserves. Perhaps instead we should empower some entity to punish and thereby communicate "our" intolerance of the wrongdoing. But it is far from obvious how we could empower the relevant entity to do the punishing for us. How is it that the government of, say, India, communicates my reprobation of a serious moral violation by incarcerating some wrongdoer?

The worry, then, is that we must either fail morally (by not punishing and thereby accepting a violation), or overpunish (by all communicating our reprobation), or else we find ourselves with a moral duty to form institutions to punish. The first two seem unpleasant results, and the final one seems a strange result for a theory of moral responsibility to generate all on its own.

Of course, in some sense, Boxer can retain the basic conclusion of the book by dropping reliance on punishment. If punishment isn't required for at least some blaming, then that is just one further avenue for ultimate responsibility's relevance that is blocked off. Still, to the extent that Boxer relies on the relevance of punishment in constructing and defending her own positive picture, it's unclear that jettisoning punishment would be a welcome option.

Finally, some may question the dialectical strategy of the book. The advertised conclusion is that incompatibilists need better arguments in defense of their position. And while the initial pages do make clear that extant arguments relying on ultimate responsibility are wanting, the remainder of the project proceeds by defending a positive view of moral responsibility, and arguing that it does not require ultimate responsibility. But it is surely one thing to give a respectable account of some phenomenon which does not appeal to some controversial condition, and quite another to argue that this shows views which appeal to that condition to be false. One gets the uneasy feeling that, despite coming to the project with incompatibilist sympathies, Boxer's view of the debate is that incompatibilists fail so long as there is a respectable compatibilist account in the offing.

This uneasiness is exacerbated when one considers that one of the most popular incompatibilist arguments these days, the so-called manipulation argument, is not really taken up by Boxer. (While she considers Pereboom's '4-Case Argument', she treats it as an argument for an ultimate responsibility condition rather than incompatibilism more generally.) These arguments claim that compatibilist conditions on responsibility can be met by agents who are manipulated into acting by others. (The manipulation usually takes the form of 'psychological programming', where old values and dispositions are replaced with new ones.) Then, these arguments claim that there is no relevant difference between the manipulated agent and ordinary agents in a deterministic universe. Thus, since the manipulated agent isn't responsible (due to the manipulation), neither are ordinary agents if determinism is true. Therefore, incompatibilism is true.

Manipulation arguments need not explicitly depend on a notion of ultimate responsibility, and whether they smuggle in such a notion implicitly is an open question. But given their popularity, and their aim to establish incompatibilism, their absence from the discussion is unfortunate, especially because, so far as I can see, manipulation arguments could target Boxer's own view as well as that of any compatibilist. The victim of covert psychological management would not obviously be subject to either the set of excuses or exemptions that free one from the moral reactive attitudes by their own internal standards of appropriateness. And, indeed, apart from an unorthodox causal background, such agents could still be normal adult human beings, now with defects of character they are unconditionally obligated to eliminate. Manipulation arguments are controversial, and certainly not decisive on their own, but failing to engage more directly with them restricts the scope of Boxer's conclusion even should her arguments be sound.

The debate over the compatibility of moral responsibility and determinism is full of subtle difficulties, entrenched and recalcitrant positions, and what often seem dialectical stalemates. Rethinking Responsibility is an important and refreshing addition to that debate. In my view, the book is less remarkable for its challenge to incompatibilism than for the positive claims it advances. It is Boxer's defense of her own position, including important forays into the nature of desert and punishment, that most warrants our attention, and which will repay readers interested in moral responsibility, problems of agency, and free will.