Rethinking the Ethics of Clinical Research: Widening the Lens

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Alan Wertheimer, Rethinking the Ethics of Clinical Research: Widening the Lens, Oxford University Press, 2011, 356pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199743513.

Reviewed by Henry Richardson, Georgetown University


As this book demonstrates, those working on medical research ethics are fortunate that a political philosopher as astute and insightful as Alan Wertheimer has been lured into devoting the culminating phase of his career to their subject. Moral philosophers are equally fortunate that Wertheimer has been willing forthrightly to tackle a series of fundamental questions that arise in a particularly challenging form in the fraught terrain of medical research ethics, where an existing regulatory framework and a history of scandals conspire to short-circuit argumentative clarity, leaving many meaty and important issues crying for perspicuous analysis.

Wertheimer directly and courageously challenges a series of received views on the subject: that informed consent to participate in research essentially involves the subject's autonomous (and so understanding) authorization of the proceedings; that the tendency of prospective subjects to confuse research with ordinary clinical care (the "therapeutic misconception") problematizes their consent; that paying subjects to participate in research is morally problematic and is likely to result in morally criticizable "undue inducement"; that all exploitation of research subjects ought to be prohibited by the regulations governing medical research; and that medical researchers clearly have special obligations to their subjects that underwrite such benefits as making drugs proved successful available to the subjects after the trial and seeing to it that all subjects get "standard of care" treatment rather than, say, merely a placebo.

While perhaps no thoughtful writer on medical research ethics signs on to every one of these claims, together they do currently represent the canonical commitments of the field. With regard to each, Wertheimer takes a "show me" attitude: he wants to set aside the rhetoric and see the arguments. And in sorting through the arguments, deploying the clear, case-based style for which he is well known, he constructively sorts through more detailed aspects of each of these issues than has almost anyone else. In the course of so doing, he develops a broad approach to medical research ethics that is a strong competitor to the received wisdom.

One reason that medical research ethics is both prone to dogmatism and full of philosophically interesting quirks and gaps is that it is a field that has come to be defined around a set of regulations that have the force of law. The most influential regulations have been those adopted by the United States in response to the scandals at Tuskegee and elsewhere. These have since been imitated around the world and supplemented by various sets of non-binding guidelines. Wertheimer addresses both some of the central provisions of this framework and some of the ways in which bioethicists have attempted to fill its gaps, which mainly have to do with researchers' positive obligations towards their research participants.

At the level of regulation, Wertheimer's overall view is that we must be highly suspect of blocking consenting adults from engaging in mutually advantageous transactions. At the level of moral principle, he raises serious doubts about the possibility that there is any sound moral argument that would show that it is "morally worse" to enter in to a consensual and mutually advantageous transaction with another than to refuse to transact with that other. He widens the angle of view so as constantly to put before us analogous situations involving not medical research but sex, commerce, gambling, employment, marriage, gift-giving, or clinical medicine. He convincingly shows that the elements of the received view in medical research ethics catalogued above are notably more restrictive than we tend to be in these other areas. Who, for instance, thinks that we should prohibit someone from proceeding with a love affair just because one partner is under a "romantic misconception" about the other's intentions (80)? In all of these arenas, we must be aware that regulations and proposed moral prohibitions can err in two directions: by failing to prohibit harmful transactions that should be prohibited and by prohibiting valuable transactions that should be allowed (71).

Because most of medical research ethics is embodied in regulations that do prohibit certain types of transaction, it raises issues of paternalism. In an early chapter, after laying out the "conceptual geography" of paternalism in a helpfully lucid and authoritative way, Wertheimer catalogues just how paternalistic the received view is. As he indicates, this is not necessarily to condemn it: some paternalism, especially the "soft" paternalism typical of this subject, can be justified. Still, the paternalism involved raises the ante for any purported justification.

The core of the book consists of three chapters in which Wertheimer, drawing on his previous books, masterfully addresses core elements of the received view: one on consent, one on monetary inducement to participate, and one on exploitation.

The chapter on consent draws from his examination of that topic in the also fraught and difficult terrain of sex in Consent to Sexual Relations (Cambridge, 2003). Here, his wide-angle view enables him to raise a fundamental question: what is it about medical research that justifies requiring "informed consent" -- that is, a level of consent that goes beyond plain vanilla consent? Some (including, at one time, the author of this review) have thought that because medical research dramatically involves using people as means, the Kantian injunction not to use people as mere means applies with special force to this area. Thoughtfully exploring various of the going interpretations of this inscrutable injunction, Wertheimer effectively debunks the claim that medical research is specially dicey in this way. Perhaps, though, medical research is like sex in that consent is necessary for proceeding? Wertheimer argues that the answer is "no" -- and not just because of special exceptions such as research on emergency-room procedures. Controversially, he argues that under certain circumstances it might be permissible to conscript people as research participants just as we conscript people into the army (56f.). Although he convincingly shows that medical research is not different from various more freely treated areas of life simply because it involves the body or serious risks, he does allow that the combination of fragile social trust, asymmetries of information, probability of subjects' confusion, and the uncommonness of research participation make at least a pragmatic case for treating it specially (114-5).

With regard to consent, Wertheimer largely bypasses the "ontological" or linguistic question of what consent "is" in order to concentrate on when consent is "morally transformative" -- that is, on when it gives another special permissions. He nonetheless offers some inconclusive discussion of the idea of "valid" as opposed to transformative consent. That is because his previous work has left him wonderfully aware of the myriad ways consent transactions can misfire. The consenter can mishear a request to borrow a lawnblower as a request to borrow a lawnmower (74). The colleague may be daydreaming during the department meeting when the chair asks for unanimous consent for an important new measure (73). These cases suggest that, in the general case, we do not have very high state-of-mind requirements on transformative consent. Taking the "point" of consent to be to convey permission to another, Wertheimer further effectively argues against Heidi Hurd's position that consent can consist in a state of mind unexpressed in word or action (72).

The chapter on monetary inducements to participate in research powerfully challenges current research-ethics orthodoxy, which takes them to be highly problematic in developing-world contexts. Wertheimer recognizes that there exist trials that are too risky, dangerous, or deceptive to be allowed. Those, he says, are practically important but philosophically uninteresting. Even so, he puts the orthodoxy under pressure as to where the borderline between unreasonably risky and reasonably risky studies lies. He builds a powerful and sustained argument that monetary payments should be taken into account in determining this boundary: a payment can make it reasonable to participate in a study that would be unreasonable to participate in absent that payment. He urges that the orthodoxy is inconsistent in insisting on respecting individuals' judgments about whether to participate in a risky trial that is "otherwise approvable" but refusing to respect their judgments about whether accepting a trial's risks is overall reasonable in light of the benefits (including monetary ones) that trial participation offers (126). As to the pervasive worry that monetary payments can unduly induce trial participation, Wertheimer argues that "Genuine offers do not coerce. Period" (144). The only inducements that are capable of undoing the voluntariness requisite to morally transformative consent are ones that cloud individuals' rational capacities. Although he here builds on his book, Coercion (Princeton, 1987), this discussion engages thoroughly with the research-ethics debates about undue inducement.

Turning to the topic of exploitation in research ethics, Wertheimer again draws on prior work -- this time, his book, Exploitation (Princeton, 1996) -- to lend his account depth and breadth. Thoroughly canvassing the discussions of exploitation in research ethics, he persuasively shows that it is marked by an excess of loose rhetoric and an absence of careful argument. Rather than dictating what the relevant sense of "exploitation" is in this context, he distinguishes different types of exploitation. He notes that the core idea is that of taking unfair advantage of someone, but frankly concedes (and asserts) that he knows of no unproblematic general account of fairness in transactions. Here again, for the sake of argument and philosophical interest, he concentrates on mutually advantageous, consensual transactions. In such contexts, he argues, exploitation does not necessarily nullify the morally transformative force of consent. Turning to the practical, regulatory perspective, he rebuts a range of arguments for prohibiting such exploitation, underlining the distinction between taking advantage of someone's misfortune, which is not morally problematic, and taking unfair advantage of someone, which is. Controversially, he takes the former case to include ones in which the person is being coerced by another (93). The implications of these arguments for medical research ethics are striking, undercutting most reasons for thinking that medical researchers proceeding with studies that are not unreasonably harmful or risky could be exploiting their subjects. Further, and more specifically, they undercut the standard case for assuring post-trial availability of successful drugs to trial participants.

While the whole of the book will be as bracingly refreshing to medical research ethics as an early-summer swim in a mountain lake, its final chapter is philosophically the most interesting. It deals with material that is newest for its author and that is also least well settled in the medical research community. Here, he engages with a cluster of issues that were not well handled by the field-shaping regulations because they fall under the general rubric of benevolence rather than that of the prevention of harm or exploitation. These include being responsive to host-community needs when doing research in developing countries, providing "standard care" even to one's subjects in developing countries, providing post-trial ("fair") benefits, and providing "ancillary-care" -- medical care that study participants need but that is required neither by sound science nor by trial safety. Here, Wertheimer's philosophical press goes deepest.

Although each of these issues is quite distinct, he plausibly recognizes the standard positions on each of them as expressing attachment to what he calls the "Interaction Principle": the idea that special obligations not contractually undertaken can arise from transactions that are already otherwise mutually advantageous and consensual. He argues that this principle has two unpalatable corollaries (257). First, one must deny the "Non-Worseness Claim": the claim that it cannot be "morally worse" for a mutually advantageous, consensual interaction to occur than for there to be no (such) transaction between the relevant parties. The Interaction Principle seems to imply this because, in burdening mutually advantageous transactors with additional obligations it will, insofar as it serves as a guide to action, lead some of those transactors to forego the transaction rather than fulfilling this additional burden. Second, one must accept the "Greater Obligation Claim," which is the claim that, among potential beneficiaries of one's actions, those with whom one is engaged in a mutually advantageous, consensual transaction can sometimes have stronger claims to help than those with whom one is not.

Wertheimer's discussion of the Non-Worseness Claim takes us into the heart of some of the most active debates in moral theory. Whereas his interlocutors in most of the rest of the book are proponents of the standard views in medical research ethics, here his interlocutors include Derek Parfit, Francis Kamm, and Larry Temkin. Wertheimer finds himself drawn, as many do, to a "person-affecting" account of moral reasons. If an alternative is not worse for anyone, then how can it be morally worse overall? Wertheimer turns to the philosophers just mentioned for possible answers to this question. He discusses the following case of Parfit's (290). Person A is faced with the following three alternatives:

  1. Not helping B at all
  2. Saving one of B's arms while incurring some risk
  3. Saving both of B's arms while incurring the same risk as in (2)

Parfit argues that even if it would be permissible to choose (1), it would be "perverse" to choose (2) rather than (3). Wertheimer is sympathetic, but doesn't see the argument. He suggests that the concern seems to be with fairness, but that fairness is to be understood in person-affecting terms. Since he has asserted that a general account of fairness in transactions is beyond our grasp, I am not sure how he knows this. There is indeed a kind of irrationality in choosing (2) over (3); but since we are, by hypothesis, in the territory of the supererogatory, it is not straightforward how to give this irrationality a moral cast. I suspect that what here is causing trouble is the ill-explicated notion of the "morally worse." Although Wertheimer suggests that this notion is responsive both to axiological and deontological factors, he nowhere explains how this aggregation of such disparate inputs is supposed to work. It may well be that to get a non-consequentialist moral picture off the ground, we need a richer set of deontological categories (not only that of the supererogatory, but also, say, that of the unseemly or the gratuitously cruel). Once we have these, then we may want to do without the category of the "morally worse" and hence resist the claim that the Interaction Principle implies anything about the Non-Worseness Claim.

About the Greater Obligation Claim, Wertheimer is more tentative. He recognizes that any proper basis for a non-voluntary special obligation could present a well-grounded instance of the Greater Obligation Claim. While he is suspicious of facile assertions of special obligations in the area of medical research, he is not closed to the possibility that there are relevant non-voluntary, special obligations. In treating medical researchers' ancillary-care obligations, about which I have written extensively, he effectively rebuts various of my earlier attempts to explain why medical researchers have special obligations to their research participants that they did not voluntarily undertake. Here, his arguments are for the most part fair and persuasive. Thankfully, I have had enough prior exposure to his ideas that I now think I have an argument that may escape the sort of inexorable, Wertheimean rational pressure under which my prior attempts buckled.

Wertheimer's unflinchingly honest, straight-shooting approach to the moral grounds of medical research ethics has in this way been invaluable to me. Now that Rethinking the Ethics of Clinical Research is out, the whole of the research-ethics community can gain the benefit of his dissection of the subject. General moral philosophers, for their part, should turn to this book for its detailed, insightful discussion of transactional ethics. Those working on medical research ethics cannot afford not to study and engage with this work; those working in moral philosophy would be ill-advised to ignore it.