Rethinking the Gods: Philosophical Readings of Religion in the Post-Hellenistic Period

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Peter Van Nuffelen, Rethinking the Gods: Philosophical Readings of Religion in the Post-Hellenistic Period, Cambridge University Press, 273pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012035.

Reviewed by George Boys-Stones, Durham University


The 'post-Hellenistic' period, beginning as it does with the closure of the philosophical schools in Athens during the Mithradatic wars of the 80s BC, is characterised by new configurations of philosophical identity and interaction. In Rethinking the Gods, Peter Van Nuffelen considers developments in the relationship between philosophy and religion in particular, developments which he argues are distinctive of the period: rooted, but not developed in earlier thought, and overtaken by new directions in Plotinian Platonism later on (cf. 241). These developments coalesce around two themes. (Van Nuffelen talks in fact about 'discourses' rather than 'themes': I shall have something to say about this below.) The first, occupying four chapters that constitute Part I of the book, is the way in which Stoics and especially Platonists come to suppose that religious practices were shaped by ancient wisdom; the second (in Part II: another four chapters) is the hierarchical conceptualisation of the cosmos which the same philosophers used to think about ideals for global political order. These themes (further explored in Part III through the indirect testimony of alternative and subversive witnesses) may be more closely linked than it seems at first, because it turns out that the 'ancient wisdom' which was taken to inform religious practices (theme 1) came through the intervention of philosophically-informed political leaders -- whose activity as a matter of fact conforms to the monarchical political system validated by reflection on the cosmic hierarchy (theme 2).

Although Stoics and Platonists form the main focus, the book actually begins with a fascinating and important first chapter on a figure who falls between the two: Varro, a pupil of the stoicising Academic Antiochus. Van Nuffelen argues that Varro, ultimately drawing on ideas from the Stoic Posidonius, thought that religious institutions were constructed and manipulated by political rulers as an alternative means of preserving and communicating truths (alternative, that is, to the philosophical tradition itself). A concrete example of this uncovered by Van Nuffelen deserves setting out. We are told that Varro attributed the introduction of images into Roman religion to the 'ancients' (antiqui), but also that he thought that Roman religion lasted for 170 years without using images (Divine Antiquities fr. 225 Cardauns). But 170 AUC, Van Nuffelen notes, puts us thirty-three years into the reign of Tarquinius Priscus, and we know from another fragment that Tarquinius was supposed by Varro to have intervened in Roman religion (fr. 205). The obvious conclusion is that Varro believed that it was Tarquinius who introduced images into Roman religion.

Varro does not often get much of an airing in histories of philosophy, and it is very good to see what can be made of him when he is taken seriously. But the pattern of thought that Van Nuffelen finds in him is not unique to Varro, and in Chapter 2 Van Nuffelen goes on to suggests that the same thing can be seen in operation in the fragments of Plutarch's lost book On the Festival of Images. This, he suggests, was a work which would have focused on the way in which ritual preserves ancient wisdom, just as Isis and Osiris focuses on its preservation in a particular 'holy narrative'. In Chapter 3, Van Nuffelen traces his theme in Numenius' account of the relationship between philosophy and religion; and in Chapter 4, he uses it to structure readings of Apuleius' Apology and Dio Chrysostom's Borysthenic Discourse (Oration 36). One of the interesting sub-plots to this last chapter is the unintended consequences to which some of the religious innovations led, notably in feeding 'superstition' among the laity where they were meant to help them towards purer reflection on god. Images, for example, were meant as illustrations, but ended up being treated as idols.

It would seem to be implicit in Van Nuffelen's account that the history of religion is going to be a history of pluralisation: local innovations will inevitably lead to a global proliferation of gods (that is: guises in which the philosopher-leaders present God to their communities). If so (but see further below), then it would be in some sense a corollary of this thought that the post-Hellenistic philosophers sought new ways to emphasise the monarchical character of the divine principle on which the cosmos in all its plurality depends. Their god is 'chorus-leader', 'shepherd', 'householder', 'captain' . . . and, as Van Nuffelen shows in Part II, is especially compared to the Great King or the Roman Emperor. These latter images are supposed to be new with the age (105) -- or anyway newly prominent. (If there were an index locorum for this book, I could be more confident in reporting and regretting what I think is the absence of any reference to the last line of Metaphysics Λ, where Aristotle famously applies the plea for monarchical political leadership in Iliad 2.204 to his own divine first principle.)

Van Nuffelen argues that philosophers used the image of the ideal ruler not only to pivot our mind away from the forms of popular religion to more direct contemplation of god, but also to connect the world of human activity with the divine realm, which becomes in its turn a paradigm for human political order. As Van Nuffelen puts it in relation to Rome in particular: 'an idealised version of it is projected onto the cosmos, and that idealisation is then held up as the paradigm for the existing empire' (109). This makes for some interesting reflections on Maximus and Aristides (Chapter 6), Dio (Chapter 7) and Plutarch again (Chapter 8), who provide the case studies for this section. I found the approach an original and helpful strategy for thinking about how to 'ground' what people often take to be the increasingly other-worldly preoccupation of Platonist philosophy in particular. Physics and politics -- the immediate realm of human activity -- are not, it is true, the objects of sustained theoretical reflection in Platonism; but Van Nuffelen here makes an innovative contribution to the increasing recognition that every impulse upwards, in the direction of metaphysics, is ultimately motivated by, and has an equal and opposite effect upon, the way we understand ourselves.

If philosophy forms the primary focus of Van Nuffelen's study, the presence of what one might think of as para-philosophical voices, such as Dio of Prusa and Maximus of Tyre, shows that this is not conceived as a book that is narrowly about philosophical theory. Indeed, as Van Nuffelen describes his own methodology, he is not interested in 'themes' or theories at all, but rather 'discourses' which happen to have been shaped by philosophers -- 'discourse' being meant here in what Van Nuffelen describes as a roughly Foucauldian sense (15). It turns out, in fact, that what Van Nuffelen thinks he is doing is uncovering tacit 'assumptions' and 'presuppositions' -- which is why subversive or polemical or 'fringe' perspectives are especially valuable to him (the idea is that they tend to play on, and so expose these assumptions).

To some extent, I find the language of 'discourse', so described, to be helpful: it is true that we do not have ancient texts that explicitly present or theorise the ideas that Van Nuffelen traces, and a focus on how people end up talking about religion certainly encourages reflection on the permeation of ideas from the philosophical academy into society. On the other hand, the strong claim that the discourse on ancient wisdom is 'less of a philosophical theory in itself than a mode of thinking that underpins an interpretation of religion' (46) seems unduly reductionist. This is not how it looks, certainly in the early stages of Van Nuffelen's account of it. Indeed, as far as I can see, the only element of the 'discourse' for which Van Nuffelen does not excavate a straightforward explanatory basis is the privileged authority with which the 'discourse' invests the instigators of the religious and philosophical traditions. My own view is that it would be very surprising if no such explanation was developed (especially given the wider importance of 'authority' as a basis for philosophical work in new movements of the era such as Aristotelianism or Platonism), and that the appeal to Foucault ultimately serves to give specious respectability to what is really a refusal to press the evidence on this score. But in any case, Van Nuffelen only sporadically thematises this notion of authority at all (as e.g., at 33, where Varro is supposed to have neglected the question of how the Samothracian mysteries came to contain philosophical truth). As far as this is concerned, then, the effort saved by the appeal to 'discourse' can hardly have been worth the trouble of reading Foucault.

And there are cracks in our evidence that the language of 'discourse' creates, in addition to those which it papers over. An egregious example comes in the discussion of Philo of Alexandria, discussed in the last section of the book as one of the subversive voices who, like Lucian (another case-study in this section), helps uncover and reveal the discourse even as he subverts it. Yet it seems to me that the two cases are radically different -- and that far from 'subverting the discourse', Philo shows himself fully committed to the theoretical perspective on which it is based. The reason that Van Nuffelen can represent him as subversive is that, by the time he gets to Philo in Chapter 10, he has decided that the 'discourse on ancient wisdom' aims at the validation of the Greco-Roman religious tradition quite specifically: even (as he says) 'essentially' (201). Yet nothing that we have heard before this suggests that the application of the model to Greek or Roman religious practices is essential

Indeed, as I suggested above in my remark about pluralisation, it seems a clear implication of Van Nuffelen's work that the model he outlines could easily be used to explain and validate other religious traditions too. (Why should they not have been shaped by wise political leaders just as those of Greece and Rome were?) Numenius, indeed, whom Van Nuffelen took as a key witness to the 'discourse' back in Chapter 3, in his programmatic statement of the traditions most useful for recovering the truth includes the Indian, Jewish, Persian, and Egyptian traditions (fr. 1a de Places). We know that he accepts the Greek and Roman traditions too, but they clearly are not 'essential' to him. So Philo, who whole-heartedly adopts every formal feature of the argument which post-Posidonian Stoics and Platonists bring to bear on the taxonomy and relative evaluation of different religious traditions, and differs only in his beliefs about the historical relationships of these traditions (Philo, of course, thinks that Jewish religion is prior, and to that extent superior, to Greek), is surely more helpfully thought of as a fellow-traveller than a critic (201). If the language of 'discourse' throws Philo together with Lucian, that might be another sign that it has exhausted its usefulness at this point.

It seems to me, then, that Van Nuffelen gets into trouble just insofar as his notion of 'discourse' denies the sense of looking for reflective, theoretical underpinning for the ideas of the philosophers. But there is no reason that I can see why appeals to discourse should not be more constructively aligned with the search for theoretical reflection. Indeed, it seems to me that Rethinking the Gods at its best exemplifies the fruits of just such an alignment. It makes a real advance in our understanding of post-Hellenistic Platonism, especially in its relationship with its cultural context, and its orientation towards politics: and not just in understanding it, but in giving us conceptual tools that can be used to develop that understanding further.