Rethinking the Good: Moral Ideals and the Nature of Practical Reasoning

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Larry S. Temkin, Rethinking the Good: Moral Ideals and the Nature of Practical Reasoning, Oxford University Press, 2012, 616pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199759446.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


The principal theme addressed by Temkin's marvelous book is the trade-offs we often make between qualitative and quantitative considerations. Quantity often counts: the number of days someone might be in pain and the number of people an action might harm are obviously important. But for many people quality counts too: even if two harms or benefits are equally long-lasting, one of them might be a worse harm or a better benefit. In fact, many hold -- and Temkin agrees -- that sometimes quality trumps quantity. They judge (to take one of his examples) that it would be worse if fifty people suffered from a severe psychosis than if practically any number of people caught a slight cold (33).

Temkin's aim is to show that our conceptual framework is in deep trouble when quality plays this role. It is part of that framework that the better-than relation is transitive. More precisely, we take it to be true (in fact, true a priori or as a matter of logic or meaning) that if A is a better state of affairs (all things considered) than B, and B better (all things considered) than C, then A must be better (all things considered) than C. The remarkable thesis of Temkin's book is that we might have to reject this transitivity. He does not argue or even claim that we should take that extreme measure. His point, rather, is that we have to give up some thesis that currently seems obvious to us: either the transitivity thesis, or the thesis that quality sometimes trumps quantity, or some other deeply held principle. If the transitivity thesis is true, Temkin argues that it is not, as many assume, true in virtue of the meaning of "good" or "better than", or in virtue of the logic of the better-than relation.

Derek Parfit's work, in particular the "Repugnant Conclusion" and "Mere Addition Paradox" of Part IV of Reasons and Persons, looms large in this book. But Thomas Nagel is also an important inspiration. In Mortal Questions, Nagel writes: "simplicity and elegance are never reasons to think that a philosophical theory is true: on the contrary, they are usually good grounds for thinking it false" (x). And in The View from Nowhere he says: "I do not feel equal to the problems treated in this book. They seem to me to require an order of intelligence wholly different from mine. Others who have tried to address the central questions of philosophy will recognize the feeling" (12). The need for further investigation of complex details and for further systematic philosophizing, and a sense of the difficulty of that task, are similarly lessons that Temkin, following Nagel, hopes to teach. Rethinking the Good, as its title suggests, is an exploratory book. It does not offer answers to the problems it raises; rather, it seeks to instill a sense of how difficult the problems are. In that respect, it is a great success.

It is also a long, intricate, and demanding work. Practically every page presents a new argument, but many other arguments develop gradually over the course of hundreds of pages. The shorter arguments often take the form of complicated examples (sometimes accompanied by charts). As a result, this book must be read very slowly. If other readers are like me, they will need to re-read it, to see how its parts fit together. It helps that Temkin writes with admirable clarity. He is always a conscientious guide, at pains to tell the reader where he is going and to summarize where he has been. (There is a helpful 16-page summary at the end of the book.) If one has a taste for a high level of abstract and systematic thought about foundational problems, the rewards of Rethinking the Good easily repay the work it demands. I have learned a great deal from it, and have thoroughly enjoyed the intellectual workout it gave me.


At least half of Rethinking the Good is devoted to what Temkin labels "Spectrum Arguments," for they are his principal tool for raising doubts about the transitivity of "better than, all things considered" (henceforth I'll use "atc" for "all things considered"). My main task here will be to explain what these arguments look like, and why Temkin says that they raise a doubt about the transitivity principle (I'll use "the transitivity principle" to refer to the principle stated more fully several paragraphs above.) I will then, in the next section, raise some questions.

Compare these two situations or "outcomes" (the word Temkin generally uses when he makes comparisons). First, a large number of people all receive the same moderately good benefit. (A cancer they all have, for example, goes into remission.) Second, a different and smaller group of people receive a benefit that is a bit better for them than this. (They have a slightly more serious form of cancer, which goes into remission.) There are no morally relevant differences between the two groups. Temkin asserts, plausibly, that if the difference between the two kinds of benefits is sufficiently small, and the larger group is sufficiently large, then the first situation is better than the second. The idea is simply that at some point the numbers -- both the degree to which the diseases differ in how bad they are for people, and the difference in the size of the two groups -- count.

Temkin calls this the "First Standard View." It says: "Trade-offs between Quality and Number are Sometimes Desirable" (30). More fully:

In general, an outcome where a larger number of people have a lower quality benefit is better than an outcome where a smaller number of people have a higher quality benefit, if the number receiving the lower quality benefit is 'sufficiently' greater than the number receiving the higher quality benefit, and if the differences in the initial situations of the people benefited and the degree to which they are benefited are not 'too' great (30).

Notice that it is not a principle about what to do, but about a relation between two states of affairs. It says that one state of affairs is better (atc) than the other. Impartial observers should for that reason wish for one of these states of affairs more than the other. Whether a certain agent should bring one of them about rather than the other is a further question (much depends on what moral relations, if any, that agent has to members of the two groups). Sometimes one ought to bring about the better of two states of affairs, but (contrary to what consequentialists think) not always.

Temkin realizes that some philosophers have questioned the intelligibility of statements to the effect that one state of affairs is quite simply better than another, but he finds their view bizarre. He sometimes talks in terms of "units of goodness per day" (110) and often speaks in terms of outcomes being good with respect to an ideal -- for example, with respect to the ideal of well-being. This suggests that in addition to there being facts about what is good for someone, there are additional facts about the goodness of what is good for someone.

There are tricky issues here, but I will set them aside in this review. (I've had my say in Against Absolute Goodness.)

If there is a "First Standard View," there must of course be a Second. (Temkin formulates six principles called "Standard Views." In addition to these, there are about 40 other items on his "List of Principles and Views," helpfully gathered together at the end of the book. Have I mentioned that this is a complicated book?) The "Second Standard View" says: "Trade-offs between Quality and Number are Sometimes Undesirable Even When Vast Numbers Are at Stake." The idea is the one I meant to convey when I said in the first paragraph that sometimes quality trumps quantity, using the example that it would be worse if fifty people suffered from a severe psychosis than if practically any number of people caught a slight cold. This is what Temkin calls an "anti-additive-aggregationist" position.

You will be attracted to the Second Standard View if you find repugnant and therefore reject what Parfit calls the "Repugnant Conclusion," which says: "For any possible population of at least ten billion people, all with a very high quality of life, there must be some much larger imaginable population whose existence, if other things are equal, would be better, even though its members have lives that are barely worth living" (Reasons and Persons, 388).

Temkin is rightly repelled by this claim, and the Second Standard View is his way of stating in general terms a principle on the basis of which the Repugnant Conclusion can be opposed. It is not so much an argument against the Repugnant Conclusion as a principle that draws some of its strength from the intuition that the Repugnant Conclusion cannot be right. It says:

If the quality of one kind of benefit is 'sufficiently' low, and the quality of another kind of benefit is 'sufficiently' high, then an outcome in which a relatively small number of people received the higher quality benefit would be better than one in which virtually any number of (otherwise) similarly situated people received the lower quality benefit (32).

Parfit's population of ten billion people with a very high quality of life is "a relatively small number of people" in comparison with the (let's suppose) trillions the quality of whose benefit is "sufficiently low" because their lives are barely worth living. The Second Standard View holds that it simply does not matter how much larger we imagine the group with the low quality of life to be: here the numbers do not count. No difference in the sizes of the two populations can outweigh the difference in the quality of their lives so as to make the state of affairs containing the larger population better than the state of affairs containing the smaller population.

So, Temkin believes that there are cases (many of them) in which the First Standard View is correct, and that there are cases (many of them) in which the Second Standard View is correct. So far, so good. These principles do not conflict with each other; the First Standard View applies to some cases, and the Second Standard View applies to others. Trouble arises, however, when we add what Temkin calls "Spectrum Arguments" to this mix.

Here is an example of the kind of Spectrum Argument he has in mind (47-48): Depression can range from extremely severe to mild, and the number of people suffering from depression can of course greatly vary as well. Ten people might be afflicted with a level eight depression (very seriously depressed on average six days a week). Or fifty people might be afflicted with a level seven depression (not quite so depressed as the first group, and for five days a week). Which outcome is better? The First Standard View seems applicable here, because it tells us that when differences between the quality of benefits (or harms) is small enough, it is outweighed if the differences in the quantity of recipients of those benefits (or harms) is large enough. The difference between a level eight depression and a level seven depression is pretty small. The significance of that difference is going to be outweighed by the significance of the difference between the sizes of the two afflicted groups.

If you think that the difference between the numbers imagined here (ten people with the most severe depression, fifty people with the slightly less severe depression) is not impressive, then just change the example. Imagine that the larger group contains one thousand people or two thousand. At some point, the difference in the size of the groups is going to be impressive, and will outweigh in importance the difference in the level of depression between the two groups (which, after all, is imagined to be slight).

So, one state of affairs, in which a smaller group suffers very intensely, is better than a second, in which a much larger group suffers somewhat less intensely, precisely because the larger group is so much larger and the difference in the two levels of suffering is so small. If one or the other of them must obtain, we should hope that it is the first rather than the second.

If that sounds reasonable, as Temkin argues it should, we are in for trouble, as you may already see. By labeling this kind of imaginary case a "Spectrum Argument," Temkin indicates that a whole range of similar cases is also to be imagined, each differing only to a small degree from the preceding case. Now imagine two groups differing in size, one with a level seven depression and the other with a level six depression; but the size of the group that is suffering somewhat less severely is much larger. And so on.

Eventually, we come to a group of people whose depression is extremely mild. Let's suppose, staying with Temkin's example, that they are "pretty down once a month" (47). Now, compare these two states of affairs: the one we started with, in which ten people are suffering from a torturous form of depression nearly all of the time; and the one we end with, in which an enormously larger population feels "pretty down" once a month. At this point, Temkin proposes, the Second Standard View seems to be applicable.

The Second Standard View is the "anti-additive-aggregationist" thesis that says (to repeat):

If the quality of one kind of benefit is 'sufficiently' low, and the quality of another kind of benefit is 'sufficiently' high, then an outcome in which a relatively small number of people received the higher quality benefit would be better than one in which virtually any number of (otherwise) similarly situated people received the lower quality benefit (32).

Though expressed in terms of benefits, this is equivalent to a formulation expressed in terms of harms. That reformulation would say:

If the quality of one kind of harm (e.g. severe depression) is sufficiently high, and the quality of another kind of harm (a day of feeling down) is sufficiently low, then an outcome in which a relatively small number of people received the greater harm would be worse than one in which virtually any number of . . . people received the lower quality harm.

The First Standard View, in other words, is plausibly applied to comparisons of states of affairs in which differences in quality are close to each other, whereas the Second Standard View is plausibly applied to comparisons in which differences in quality are at opposite (or at any rate distant) ends of the spectrum. For this reason, we are forced into an intransitivity. When we compare points along the spectrum that are adjacent or very close, spreading out a somewhat smaller harm over a much larger population creates a worse situation. We keep moving along this spectrum, small step by small step, each new stage being worse than the previous one. But eventually we get to a point at which we want to say that we have arrived at a better outcome -- an outcome that is better than the first one we considered. A is better atc than B, B than C, and so on -- but in the end L (or some other outcome numerically distant from A) is better than A. We seem to have found a case (in fact a whole array of cases, since we can generalize from this example) in which the transitivity of "better than atc" fails.

It is natural to suspect that some mistake in reasoning has occurred because the argument strongly resembles a sorites fallacy. If a man with a full head of hair loses just one hair, that does not make him bald. To generalize, the loss of just a single hair can never move someone from not being bald to being bald. But if we now imagine a spectrum of cases, each one of which differs from the preceding by just one hair, we are forced to the conclusion that even someone who has not a single hair is not bald.

Temkin devotes a full chapter to the charge that his Spectrum Argument against the transitivity principle is just one more case of a sorites fallacy. I think he is completely successful on this score. One way to avoid the bald man paradox is to deny the crucial premise that one hair cannot be what separates those who are not bald from those who are bald. The parallel way to avoid Temkin's Spectrum Argument would be to simply deny the First Standard View, which governs cases separated by small differences in quality. But it would be absurd to reject the First Standard View on the grounds that a difference of one hair is enough to distinguish someone who is not bald from someone who is. If we want to reject the First Standard View, despite its initial plausibility, we have to have some better reason than that. What would that better reason be? One possible reply would be: because if we accept it as well as the Second Standard View, we must reject the transitivity principle. But Temkin is not opposed to that way of reacting to the Spectrum Argument. He insists that something that we find very plausible must be rejected. But he does not insist that it is the transitivity principle that must be singled out as the trouble-maker.

The Spectrum Argument I have been considering has to do with trade-offs between the quality of benefits and harms and the number of people affected by them, but as Temkin points out (61-63), the same style of argument can be extended to other sorts of trade-offs. Imagine, for example, a series of cases in which political freedoms (rather than well-being) diminish in a series of small steps, but the number of people whose freedom is infringed keeps increasing. If the increase in the size of that population is sufficiently large, that will create an outcome that is worse than the one in which a much smaller number suffer a slightly larger loss of freedom. Here again, we will have to give up the transitivity principle, if we want to affirm analogues of the First Standard View and the Second Standard view.


If there is a weakness in these Spectrum Arguments, it may lie in the fact that they feel contrived. It is not every day that we are faced with an array of alternatives that have the trade-off profile imagined in a Spectrum Argument. Temkin's arguments do indeed create a problem for Expected Utility Theory, if the latter is construed (as it often is) as positing the transitivity principle as something that rationality demands. But suppose one has no stake in that debate. Suppose one asks whether in the ordinary course of life we should expect to encounter cases in which we have to choose between three alternatives in which A is better atc than B, B better atc than C, and C better atc than A. Can we find examples that do not have the artificiality of Temkin's Spectrum Arguments?

In a very brief section (452-456), Temkin does offer several such cases. Before I discuss one of them, consider an observation he makes elsewhere: "In baseball, it is perfectly possible that the first-place team consistently beats the second-place team, which consistently beats the third-place team, which consistently beats the first-place team" (468). The point he makes here is that although "consistently beats" is intransitive, that does not show that "all things considered is a better baseball team" is intransitive. After all, the first-place team is better than the second, the second than the third, and the first than the third. Temkin's example, in other words, assumes that there are many other teams to be considered, and that teams are ranked according to how many games they have won against the whole competitive field. So judged, there can be no intransitivity in the ranking.

I wonder, however, whether he has missed an opportunity here. Suppose there are only three teams in a league, and A always beats B, B always beats C, and C always beats A. That certainly involves no conceptual impossibility. Let's ask: which team, A or B, is better? There is a lot to be said for the idea that A is the better of these two teams: A always beats B. That way of thinking leads to the conclusion that A is better than B, B better than C, and C better than A. Now, suppose that a prize must be given to one of these teams on the basis of merit. The state of affairs in which A receives the prize might be said to be better atc than the state of affairs in which B receives it. For the same reason, B's getting the prize is better atc than C's getting it, and C's getting it is better atc than A's getting it.

No doubt, this is not a problem that we encounter every day, or that we are ever likely to encounter. But it does not have the faintest resemblance to Temkin's Spectrum Arguments, and yet it forces us to ask (as the Spectrum Arguments do not): why should we have supposed in the first place that whenever we have three items to rank, a proper ordering must be transitive? If the relationship expressed by "a better thing of a kind" can properly be intransitive, why not also the relationship expressed by "is more desirable, all things considered"?

Temkin's Spectrum Arguments do not (and are not designed to) raise doubts about whether we have strong reason to accept the transitivity principle in the first place. They instead purport to show that there are other principles that we accept, and that we cannot accept them as well as the transitivity principle. A more forceful doubt about the transitivity principle would lead us to question its basis. Can the intransitivity in the rankings of our three baseball teams be used to raise such a doubt?

Let's suppose A always beats B because it has better pitching, B always beats C because it has better batting, and C beats A because it uses statistics about past performance to make strategic decisions. Which is the best of the three teams all things considered -- that is, considering pitching, batting, and strategy? We should not be lulled by the phrase "all things considered" into supposing in advance that each of these three standards of comparison must apply with equal force in all three pairwise comparisons, or that any factor relevant in one competition will remain so in another. When A plays B, pitching is what matters most. When B plays C, it's batting that matters most. When A plays C, it's strategy. (C might use statistics against A but rely solely on intuition when pitted against B.) The standards by which we make these judgments do not remain constant throughout the evaluative process, each always having the same relevance and force. That assumption may lie behind our initial confidence that "better than" must be a transitive relation. If so, reflection will undermine that confidence. (When I speak here of a shift in "relevance" and "force" I am borrowing terms and ideas that Temkin himself employs when, in the later chapters of his book, he contrasts what he calls the "Internal Aspects View" and the "Essentially Comparative View." I will return to these two views in Section III.)

Consider, for purposes of contrast, the principle that if outcome A is better atc than B, then it is not also the case that B is better than A. It is hard to believe that this can admit of exceptions. Of course, A can be better than B in one respect and B better than A in a different respect. But when all things are considered -- that is, when all of the respects in which one is superior to the other or vice versa are taken into account -- it cannot be the case that A is better than B and B better than A. That is because there is no possibility that the standards by which the two are compared might differ, when we ask both "Is A better atc than B?" and "Is B better atc than A?" But matters are entirely different when three items are being compared, because here the possibility does arise that when A is compared to B, B to C, and C to A, different standards of comparison are in play. We may slide from thinking that "all things considered" in a two-way comparison always refers to the same standards to the assumption that this remains the case when we make three-way comparisons. If so, the transitivity of "better than" will seem as secure as its anti-symmetry. But clearly that is a mistake.

The conclusion I have drawn, then, from my encounter with Temkin's book is not exactly one that he endorses. He argues that the transitivity principle is one of several that form an inconsistent set, and that the proper reaction to this situation (at least for now, until more philosophical work is done) is honest bafflement rather than the rejection of any one of them. But when I consider the First Standard View ("Trade-offs between Quality and Number are Sometimes Desirable"), the Second Standard View ("Trade-offs between Quality and Number are Sometimes Undesirable Even When Vast Numbers Are at Stake"), and the thesis that the transitivity principle is a necessary or analytic truth, or known a priori, it is the latter that strikes me as the most open to doubt of the three. After all, the two Standard Views are quite modest: they say that sometimes this or that tradeoff is desirable, and they offer you your choice of numbers; further, they do not purport to be necessary truths or known a priori. That the transitivity principle is necessarily true or known a priori is a far more ambitious proposition. In light of these differences, should it not be the modal and epistemic status of transitivity that arouses more suspicion?

Suppose it is provisionally agreed, at least for the sake of argument, that the transitivity of "better than atc" does not have the status of a necessary or a priori truth, and even that there are occasional exceptions. The question would still have to be asked: can we, for most or all practical purposes, set those exceptions aside as mere intellectual curiosities? Do we frequently, or on important occasions, encounter situations in which we face an array of at least three alternatives between which we must choose, but which cannot be transitively ordered? And if this does happen, how serious a problem does that create for reasoned deliberation?

The spectra involving trade-offs between the quantity and quality of benefits and harms that Temkin examines in the early chapters of his book are not designed to address these questions. Recall that they ask us to compare a large array of situations: (A) a small number of people will have the most severe depression, (B) a different and much larger group will have a slightly less severe depression; and so on until (J) an ever so much larger group will feel slightly down upon occasion. The number of people involved is not precisely fixed: they are whatever numbers make it hard to resist the conclusion that (A) is less bad than (B), (B) less bad than (C), and so on. The example, in other words, is a thought experiment that works only because the imagination is left free to run wild. It supports an important conceptual point, but it is a contrivance rather than a problem we are likely to face.

Suppose nonetheless that such a spectrum does present itself to us, and we have to make a practical decision, from an impartial perspective, about which alternative to promote. What we would be faced with, then, is a situation in which no matter what we do there is a better alternative. So what? We have lived for a long time with the realization that sometimes no matter what we do we are not choosing the best alternative. In the cases we are most familiar with, that is because there is an equally good alternative. Sometimes we feel comfortable picking between two equally good options by flipping a coin; but at times we face an agonizing choice that it would be wrong to resolve in this manner. What the failure of the transitivity principle would show, if it were part of everyday life, is that an analogous agony faces us when our alternatives are three (or more) rather than two. (Of course, we have to be careful not to be victims of a money pump, should we encounter intransitivities. That is, we should not pay to move from one alternative to another, and then to another, and then to another . . . ) Admittedly, our agony would be somewhat greater: it is harder to live with the idea that we have to forego a better option than it is to live with the idea that there was an equally good option that we had to turn down. But it is not as though practical reason would be required (as Temkin supposes) to re-think its conceptual framework, when faced with an intransitivity. It would just have to avoid the money pump and take its lumps. Spectra of the sort that Temkin uses do not seem to show that the problem is more serious than that.

Further reflection on the sort of problem discussed earlier -- three teams and for each there is a better -- suggests that when intransitivity threatens we can find alternative ways of ordering our options. Suppose I must buy one of these three teams, and I want to base my choice on some standard of athletic merit. I can reasonably believe that the best single yardstick for evaluating them is that of winning games -- who consistently beats whom? -- but since that standard yields no way of making a non-arbitrary decision, I can settle for a second-best standard. I can, for example, buy the team that gets the most runs. Similarly, when I need to hire the best candidate for a job, and my first attempt to order them, which uses the criteria that strike me as soundest, results in an intransitivity, I can move to some second-best criterion that allows there to be a best choice, a second-best choice, and so on, all of them transitively arrayed. If there always or usually is an acceptable way -- it need not be the ideal way -- of transitively ranking alternatives, then the mere conceptual possibility of intransitivity is not, for practical purposes, a threat.

At one point, Temkin suggests (as I have mentioned) that intransitive orderings are to be found with some regularity in everyday life, and he gives a lovely example drawn from his own experience. He had to choose between these three options: (A) spend $800 to install a fireplace in his den; (B) spend $1100 to install a double-sided fireplace that would warm both his den and his study; (C) go without a fireplace. (B) seemed better than (A) because the additional value of a double-sided fireplace seemed worth the extra $300. (A) seemed better than (C), because having a fireplace seemed worth the price of $800. But (C) seemed better than (B), because $1,100 seemed too steep a price, given how infrequently he would use the fireplace. "I went around and around in my thinking about this issue, unable to rationally resolve it," he reports (452). Upon reflection, he now suggests, the reason he had so much trouble with this problem is that his options were genuinely arrayed intransitively; it was not vacillation or indecisiveness that was the root of his problem, but the actual relation between the objective value of his alternatives.

But it is hard to put much stock in this example and others like them. (In a way, Temkin admits as much: these cases occupy only three pages, and they are presented at a late stage in his book.) Surely, part of the difficulty Temkin faced arose from his lacking important information: How much pleasure would he get from each of the alternative fireplaces? How often would he use them? What would be the consequences of his spending $800 or $1100? It is much easier to believe that these uncertainties were the grounds for Temkin's sense of the difficulty of his decision than to believe that he was responding, as reason required, to an intransitivity in the objective value of his three alternatives. If he had decisively chosen one of the three options, it is unlikely that anyone would have taken him to task on the grounds that he had been misperceiving his trilemma -- he actually was faced with a problem in which for every alternative there was a better. It would be crazy to criticize someone in this way. That is because a reasonable way of reacting to the appearance of an intransitivity is to keep examining one's options until a transitive ordering can reasonably be imposed on them.

The lesson I take away from Temkin's book is this: Although it is perfectly reasonable to look for standards for ranking states of affairs that make them transitively ordered, so that when A is atc better than B and B atc better than C, A is atc better than C, our grounds for looking for this neat way of ranking states of affairs need not be that the intransitivity of the relation expressed by "better than atc" is a conceptual impossibility. For practical purposes, any such intransitivity is a bummer. (To say the least -- "bummer" will be too mild a word when the stakes are high.) Even if we can easily avoid a money pump, it's painful to recognize that if we rank our alternatives as our best standard of comparisons dictate, every alternative under consideration is surpassed by some other. But it is not legitimate to infer from the fact that we have good practical reasons for disliking and avoiding such intransitivities that they are conceptual impossibilities.


The later chapters of Rethinking the Good explore two opposed ways of thinking about moral ideals, which Temkin calls the "Essentially Comparative View" and the "Internal Aspects View." The former holds, and the latter denies, that "an outcome may have one value when considered by itself, another when compared with another outcome, yet another value when compared with several other outcomes, and so on" (467). This makes the Essentially Comparative View sound bizarre, but Temkin argues that both it and the Internal Aspects View have great plausibility, even though one denies what the other affirms. If one adopts the Internal Aspects View, then "better than atc" will indeed express a transitive relation; not so, if one instead adopts the Essentially Comparative View. A full exploration of Temkin's thesis that there is much to be said for and much against the principle of transitivity would have to consider his extended discussion of these two opposed ways of thinking about ideals. (The example I borrowed from Temkin in Section II of this review, in which team A beats B, B beats C, and C beats A, suggests that the Essentially Comparative View has more to be said in its favor than the Internal Aspects View. Just as a baseball team cannot be good except in comparison with some real or hypothetical team than which it is better, so a state of affairs cannot be good except in comparison with some real or imagined alternative. But Temkin presents the Essentially Comparative View and the Internal Aspects View as frameworks between which it is difficult to choose.)

A thorough discussion of Rethinking the Good would also have to ask whether the things that Temkin takes to be ideals -- equality of well-being, maximin, perfection -- really should be accorded that status. The examples he uses in later parts of the book take it for granted that one reason to want people to have an equal amount of well-being is simply that such equality is one of several things that, like well-being itself, has value. Here his ideas depend and elaborate on the framework he defended in his first book, Inequality (Oxford University Press, 1993).

There is much more in Rethinking the Good that I have had to neglect, because of the length limits of this review. It is a rich and challenging work, and a profound contribution to that part of moral philosophy that seeks a ground for decision-making in the evaluation of states of affairs.1]

[1] I am grateful to David Copp and Larry Temkin for their helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.