Rethinking the History of Skepticism: The Missing Medieval Background

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Henrik Lagerlund (ed.), Rethinking the History of Skepticism: The Missing Medieval Background, Brill, 2010, 234pp., $138.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004170612.

Reviewed by Giorgio Pini, Fordham University


Skepticism, in one or another of its many forms, is known to have thrived in both ancient and early modern times, and it may be considered as a permanent fixture of contemporary epistemological discussions. The Middle Ages, however, is not usually considered an interesting time for skepticism. By collecting the nine essays that constitute this volume, Henrik Lagerlund's intention is to show the inadequacy of this view. Even though virtually nobody was willing to describe himself as a skeptic, skepticism did not disappear in the Middle Ages.

As the subtitle of this volume indicates, the emphasis is put on the "background" that medieval discussions of skepticism are supposed to offer to early modern views. The editor suggests that for a long time "it was assumed that skepticism was not a problem in the Middle Ages" (p. 1). On the face of it, this claim is a slight exaggeration. Medieval debates on certitude and divine deception have been known and studied since the first decades of the twentieth century. More than twenty years ago, Marilyn Adams offered an excellent overview and assessment of medieval discussions concerning or involving skepticism in several medieval authors, including Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus, William Ockham, Adam Wodeham, and Nicholas of Autrecourt.[1] More recently, Dominik Perler (who also contributes an essay to this collection) devoted an entire book on the topic of medieval skepticism.[2] Nevertheless, it may still be the case that little is known about this topic outside the circle of specialists of later medieval thought. Accordingly, Lagerlund's enthusiasm in stressing the importance of the Middle Ages in the history of skepticism is praiseworthy. More controversial is his contention that epistemological skepticism was a "major concern" in the later medieval period and that "the very same issues and concerns which are later raised in relation to modern science were in the fourteenth century raised in relation to Aristotelian science" (pp. 212-213).

With the exception of the first two essays, most of the volume is devoted to epistemological discussions in the Latin West in the thirteenth and especially the fourteenth century.

After Lagerlund's introductory essay, Taneli Kukkonen considers the position of the Islamic thinker, al-Ghazali (1058-1111), whose views on causality have sometimes been compared to Hume's. Kukkonen convincingly argues that Ghazali's claims should rather be interpreted against the background of Islamic debates on God's agency. In the next essay, Martin Pickavé offers a detailed reading of Henry of Ghent's use of Academic arguments taken from Cicero's Lucullus at the end of the thirteenth century and proposes an original interpretation of Henry's complex doctrine of divine illumination. Pickavé argues that the criticisms that Scotus leveled at Henry went largely off target. His conclusion is that neither Henry nor Scotus took "skepticism seriously enough to really engage with its challenges" (p. 94). In the fourth essay, Claude Panaccio and David Piché consider Ockham's famous claim that God can cause in us an intuitive cognition of what does not exist but that such a cognition triggers a true judgment that the object of such a perception does not exist. Panaccio and Piché convincingly argue that Ockham's adoption of such a unique view was motivated by a form of reliabilism, according to which our intellect forms true judgments even when it is (miraculously) fed with false information.

Christophe Grellard, in the fifth essay, considers the nuanced position of possibly the most famous among the medieval "skeptics," the fourteenth-century thinker Nicholas of Autrecourt. Grellard concludes that, even though Nicholas did not regard himself as a skeptic, his views do raise skeptical worries because of his claim that absolute evidentness can be had only about the principle of non-contradiction and propositions that can be deduced from it. Grellard also takes into account the (rather weak) ways in which Nicholas tried to defend sensory evidence against the skeptical challenge that he himself had raised. In the next essay, Gyula Klima compares the two strategies adopted by Thomas Aquinas and the fourteenth-century thinker, John Buridan, concerning skepticism. Klima argues that while Buridan countered skepticism by adopting the view that there are several degrees of evidentness, Aquinas held a theory of cognition where skeptical challenges could not even arise.

In the volume's seventh essay, Perler considers the debate developed by several fourteenth-century thinkers on whether God can deceive us by making us perceive what does not exist. Perler suggests that that debate should be considered as part of a general crisis concerning the notion of causation. Lagerlund, in the next essay, considers Buridan's and Albert of Saxony's discussions of skepticisms in their commentaries on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics and argues for the occurrence of a radical shift in the theories of cognition in the fourteenth century and for the emergence of a consequent skeptical crisis. In the last essay of this collection, Elisabeth Karger turns again to the view that there are different degrees of evidentness, which Buridan developed in answer to the skeptical concerns evoked by Nicholas of Autrecourt. She notices the success of Buridan's view, which was adopted by Albert of Saxony, John of Mirecourt, and Pierre d'Ailly. She ends by considering an answer to Buridan's view which was proposed by a sixteenth-century thinker, Antonio Coronel, and concludes that Coronel's challenge is not entirely successful.

Rather than a mere collection of essays on skeptical issues in the Middle Ages, Lagerlund aims to give us an outline of the history of medieval skepticism and an assessment of its importance. He sums up his general point in the following passage:

External world skepticism has long been seen as a problem that first appeared with Descartes in the seventeenth century. We now know that this is not the case … It is however in the fourteenth century with the growing specter of possible divine deception that external world skepticism becomes a general problem for philosophy. The possibility that God could be a deceiver had a profound effect on philosophy in the Middle Ages. It reaches its culmination in Descartes's first meditation, but does not take its start there. (p. 19)

By and large, Lagerlund's point is well taken. Fourteenth-century discussions on the possibility of God's deception are an original contribution to the history of skepticism and a source for early modern debates. There are some problems, however, with the history of medieval skepticism as presented by Lagerlund and assumed by several of the volume's other authors.

At least three facts concerning the history of medieval skepticism can be now considered as solidly established. The first fact is Henry of Ghent's role in bringing several arguments taken from Cicero's Lucullus back into the philosophical arena at the end of the thirteenth century. As Pickavé rightly remarks, Cicero's Lucullus was almost never mentioned before Henry (p. 70). The second solidly established fact about medieval skepticism is the recurrence in the fourteenth century of discussions concerning God's power to bypass created agents and to produce directly what is normally caused by a certain created cause, for example heat in the absence of fire. When applied to human cognition, God's omnipotence entails that He can create a perception to which no external object corresponds. It follows that we can never be certain of the veridicality of our perceptions. This view is considered in most of the essays collected in this volume (by Panaccio and Piché, Grellard, Klima, Perler, Lagerlund, and Karger).

The third solidly established fact about medieval skepticism is the role played by Buridan in challenging the infallibilist theory of knowledge that prompted the skeptical scenario just evoked. Buridan distinguished between two kinds of evidentness, which came to be known as "absolute" and "natural" evidentness, respectively. Since it is always possible for God to create a certain effect directly and, specifically, to create in us a perception to which no object corresponds in the external world, Buridan conceded that we cannot reach absolute evidentness and that the judgments we make on the basis of sensory evidence may always turn out to be false (e.g., I think that the heat I feel is caused by the fire in front of me, but it is possible for such a heat to be caused directly by God; as a matter of fact, it is not even certain that there is a fire in front of me, for God may be causing my act of seeing that fire even in the absence of fire). But Buridan also contended that ordinarily we do not need absolute evidentness and can be satisfied with the so-called "natural" evidentness, according to which a certain judgment is evidently true if it appears so to our faculties, provided that God does not interfere in the natural causal story. Lagerlund, Klima, and Karger all stress Buridan's role in shaping this answer to the skeptical challenges that emerged in the fourteenth century. It should be mentioned that, as Lagerlund rightly remarks (p. 22), the originality and importance of Buridan's position was already emphasized by Jack Zupko several years ago.[3]

Apart from these three facts, the other elements of the history of later medieval skepticism presented in this collection are much more controversial. Lagerlund's story consists of four main episodes (he presents it twice, first at pp. 17-27, then at pp. 193-201). In the first episode, we encounter Thomas Aquinas. The contention is that Aquinas's Aristotelianism was not subject to the skeptical challenge because he adopted a view of cognition according to which a thought (presumably, what Aquinas called an "intelligible species") is linked to its object by a necessary relation, called "formal identity," according to which the thought and its object are supposed to be two instantiations of the same form. This interpretation of Aquinas was first put forward by Étienne Gilson, as Lagerlund notices (p. 199), and has often been repeated by Gilson's students. In this volume, it is also endorsed and very clearly presented by Klima (pp. 161-166). In his essay, Perler agrees that Aquinas is not subject to the skeptical challenge but for a different reason, namely because of his reliance on the "teleological design" of our cognitive capacities as well as his trust in our being created in God's image (pp. 177-178). In the second episode of the story, however, things go awry. After Aquinas, the Aristotelian framework collapsed because of the demise of the identity theory (Lagerlund on pp. 198-201) and/or an increasing emphasis on God's omnipotence and the consequent possibility of divine deception (Lagerlund, p. 20; Perler, pp. 178 and 189). In the third episode, sanity is temporarily restored by Buridan with his theory of the degrees of evidentness. But the situation is bound to precipitate again, and Descartes' evil demon will be the main actor of the fourth episode.

This story, attractive in its simplicity, seems to be gaining some acceptance even outside the circle of medievalists. It is therefore important to state that it is based on very flimsy historical evidence and on questionable interpretations of the texts. I will mention only three problems. First, the underlying assumption is that skepticism is a sort of eternal philosophical challenge. Thus, we always need to explain why a certain thinker is not troubled by skeptical worries. Specifically, there must be a reason why Aquinas is not concerned by skepticism, and that reason is that skepticism cannot arise in his system. This is highly questionable, however. The need to find a reason for Aquinas's attitude or rather lack of any attitude towards skepticism betrays our post-Cartesian concerns. It may well be the case that Aquinas was not worried about skepticism for no reason at all.

Second, the interpretation of Aquinas on which this story is based is extremely controversial, to say the least. The very notion of formal identity has been recently subjected to serious criticism.[4] What is more, even if something like the theory of formal identity is granted, it has been contended that skeptical challenges are not prevented from arising.[5] After all, Aquinas did claim that God can and sometimes does make us see things that do not exist (see Summa theologiae III, q. 76, a. 8). The reason why this does not count as a case of divine deception is merely that God's intention in providing us with false perceptions is not to deceive us but to make us glimpse a deeper truth, according to Aquinas. But it is a fact that nothing in Aquinas's theory of cognition prevents him from holding the view that God can and sometimes does make us perceive what is not there.

Third, the link between divine omnipotence and fourteenth-century debates on skepticism is problematic. It is true that the claim that God can bypass created agents is a necessary condition for the kind of views that were discussed in the fourteenth century. But that God was omnipotent was admitted well before the fourteenth century. Other factors seem to have played an important role in this story, for example Scotus's view that cognitive acts are intrinsically non-relative items and that consequently the relation between a cognitive act and its object is something added to the cognitive act itself and whose existence must be accounted for.

How new is the claim so often repeated or assumed in several of these essays, namely, that later medieval discussions on skepticism had an influence on early modern discussions and specifically on Descartes? As I have already mentioned, this area is better researched than we may suspect after reading this volume. Let me give just an example. Perler's nice essay on divine deception adds nothing substantial to the evidence already gathered by Tullio Gregory in an article published 36 years ago.[6] Perler dutifully refers to Gregory's article as an "overview" (p. 172, n. 2), which he largely ends up summarizing. What Perler adds to Gregory's results is at times imprecise, as when he uses a truncated quotation from Aquinas to substantiate his claim that good angels, unlike demons, can put new thoughts into us (p. 175, n. 8). Contrary to what Perler states (and as Gregory rightly remarked), Aquinas held that even good angels cannot cause new thoughts in us. What good angels can and demons cannot do is to strengthen the thoughts we have formed from sensory evidence by providing us with some extra intellectual light.

Also, Perler seems to think that demons can deceive us only by presenting us with complex images, such as that of a golden mountain, but not, apparently, by making us perceive a sensory quality that is not there, such as a color or a smell (pp. 174-175). By contrast, Aquinas did hold that demons can act on our senses in such a way that they can make us perceive what is not there -- not just fanciful things such as golden mountains but more mundane entities such as sensory qualities (red, sweet, etc.) and the corresponding images. These niceties in the interpretation of Aquinas may look negligible, but they are actually relevant for the general point made by Perler. For it is interesting to notice that Perler's slight misinterpretation of Aquinas is instrumental to his contention that skepticism was not a challenge for Aquinas because of his teleological conception of our cognitive faculties. If Aquinas's texts are read carefully, however, we find that he conceded much more to the demons' power to deceive us than Perler would like to admit. A skeptical challenge could have arisen in Aquinas, no matter how strong his trust was in the teleological organization of our cognitive faculties. If it did not, it was probably just because such a possibility never crossed Aquinas's mind.

Overall, this is an interesting collection of essays on an important and stimulating set of issues. Probably the most convincing papers are the ones that refrain from sweeping claims and hypotheses concerning the history of skepticism and medieval epistemology and focus on specific problems or thinkers, such as the impressive essays by Kukkonen, Pickavé, Pannacio and Piché, and Karger. All the papers, however, raise very interesting and important questions, even though the general reconstruction of medieval skepticism and some of the claims about Aquinas and the alleged crisis of the Aristotelian cognitive paradigm should be approached with much caution.

Unfortunately, some parts of this volume are poorly edited. There are several typos, the bibliography at the end of Lagerlund's paper on Buridan and Albert of Saxony is truncated, and several authors quoted in the volume do not appear in the index of names (for example, Nardi, Pasnau, and Stump).

[1] M. McCord Adams, William Ockham, Notre Dame, 1987, vol. 1, pp. 551-629.

[2] D. Perler, Zweifel und Gewissheit. Skeptische Debatten im Mittelalter, Frankfurt a. M., 2006.

[3] J. Zupko, "Buridan on Skepticism," Journal of the History of Philosophy, 31, 1993, 191- 221; see also his John Buridan: Portrait of a Fourteenth-Century Arts Master, Notre Dame, 2003, 183-202. Lagerlund rightly refers to Zupko's paper on p. 16.

[4] See in particular J. Brower and S. Brower-Toland, "Aquinas on Mental Representation: Concepts and Intentionality," The Philosophical Review 117, 2008, 193-243.

[5] See R. Pasnau, Theories of Cognition in the Later Middle Ages, Cambridge, 1997, pp. 295-305.

[6] T. Gregory, "Dio ingannatore e genio maligno: Nota in margine alle Meditationes di Descartes," Giornale critico della filosofia italiana, 53, 1974, 477-516; reprinted in T. Gregory, Mundana sapientia: Forme di conoscenza nella cultura medievale, Roma, 1992, pp. 401-440.