Rethinking the Ontological Argument: a Neoclassical Theistic Response

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Daniel A. Dombrowski, Rethinking the Ontological Argument: a Neoclassical Theistic Response, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 180pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521863694.

Reviewed by Sandra Visser, Valparaiso University


Daniel Dombrowski offers an encyclopedic discussion of objections to the ontological argument in his most recent book. He writes as a neoclassical theist, inspired by the process theology of Charles Hartshorne. His theism is neoclassical rather than classical since according to it God exists in time and, although God is perfect, he is always changing as a result of his interaction with the created order. The book's aim is ambitious -- to discuss objections to and inadequacies of the ontological argument offered by deconstructionist, neopragmatist, and analytic thinkers. Dombrowski wishes to make positions across the spectrum accessible and intelligible to those from other intellectual traditions and profitably analyze them. His hope is that his readers receive a more robust understanding of the challenges facing the ontological argument and appreciate how neoclassical theism solves all the relevant problems. As a result, the way is clear to argue that the ontological argument, as understood by neoclassical theists, successfully proves the existence of God. Unfortunately, not all of Dombrowski's ambitions are realized in his book. His scope ends up being too broad for him to convincingly dispatch all the objections to the ontological argument, and his existence/actuality distinction, the key to his position, does not save the ontological argument from what he takes to be a damning criticism.

Dombrowski's book is frequently frustrating to read. He regularly cites other scholars of the ontological argument. It is a strength of the book that Dombrowski has read widely on the topic and attempts to synthesize much of what has been written. Further, it is good that he attempts to bring various authors into dialogue with each other. Unfortunately, given the monograph's length, what the reader typically gets is a very short summary, frequently just a sentence or two, from the cited author. As a result, one doesn't get enough context or explanation to fully understand the points the cited author might be making, or have enough information to either agree or disagree intelligently with the point Dombrowski is using his source to make. For example, Dombrowski says that "As Griffin insightfully sees the matter, there are at least four characteristics that are essential to the classical theistic view of God." One of them is that "If and when God loves the creatures, this is a free act; nothing prevents God's hating or being indifferent to the creatures" (137). Dombrowski's summary of Griffin's position is inadequately explained. What does Griffin mean by "nothing prevents God's hating or being indifferent to the creatures?" Does Griffin mean that there is no force or being outside of God (something that is not God) which prevents him from hating creatures? If so, then the claim is not particularly controversial, but is rather uninteresting since God's character makes it impossible for him to hate his creatures. On the other hand, does Griffin mean that God could hate his creatures, but he has decided not to? That claim is a highly contentious one that few classical theists would agree with. If the latter is the correct interpretation of the claim, it would be helpful to have at least a brief sketch of how Griffin arrived at the insight. In the absence of an argument, a classical theist might reasonably reject the view that she is committed to the position that God could hate his creatures. And further, she would be justified in rejecting Dombrowski's criticism on the grounds that it proceeds from a peculiar thesis of Griffin's rather than from a position entailed by classical theism itself.

Dombrowski introduces his book as containing chapters which can fruitfully be read as a whole, but can also be read independently of each other, as a reader's interests may dictate. To some degree that is true. The book does not contain a sustained argument across the chapters, the thread of which would be lost if sampling only a chapter or two. However, some claims and references made in earlier or later chapters would be baffling if not read in light of the other chapters in the book or other works by Dombrowski. He regularly refers to the existence-actuality distinction as key to the success of the ontological argument, but only discusses it in any depth in Chapter 5 and doesn't give an adequate explanation of it in the chapters in which he merely refers to it. He mentions views of analytic philosophers in chapters about continental philosophers and refers to the substance of arguments he makes in later chapters. Thus, while one could read a chapter here and there, the book is best read as a whole, but a slightly disjointed whole, given Dombrowski's intention to make each chapter self-contained.

Finally, the most significant difficulty in reading Dombrowski's book and thus finding his work convincing arises from his desire to address as many objections to the ontological argument as possible. He races through objection after objection, covering lots of ground, but only thinly, and too often arguing by assertion or by appeal to other authorities' views. But the rapid rejection of views is too quick, and it is sure to frustrate holders of most of the views he critiques. Even though several of his chapters deal with only one author, Dombrowski covers many objections both major and minor in each one. The result is that the reader rarely gets an intellectually satisfying discussion of any of the objections. For example, he merely states that to think that humans live forever is hubris, but offers no explanation for why it's hubris other than that "[w]hat makes God distinctive is necessary existence and other perfections (134)." But a reader might quickly object that even if humans were immortal, they would not be necessary beings and so would be no threat to the distinctiveness of God for that reason. Moreover, he seems to regard belief in the doctrine of the Christian faith ("I believe in … the resurrection of the body, and the life everlasting") as hubris. Were Dombrowski to offer a more complete discussion of his point initially, he might easily forestall such reactions.

A second example of this problem occurs when he argues against a position that he attributes to Mark Taylor, namely that "if the universe is not centered in God then the centered self disintegrates as well, and, as a result, epistemological and moral criteria disintegrate (64)." Dombrowski rejects the view by replying that some philosophers, e.g. Sartre and Popper, don't believe in God and that this fact alone should not disqualify them from doing philosophy. Presumably Taylor is well aware that some atheists engage in what has traditionally been called philosophy and has given reasons to believe that either they are not really engaged in philosophy by explaining what he takes real philosophy to be. Again, a more thorough discussion of Taylor's views and Dombrowski's response to them would forestall criticisms of his analysis.

Of the many substantive difficulties I have with the book, I briefly will discuss only one. But it is the point that Dombrowski appears to take as one of the most important distinctions neoclassical theists can make, namely, the distinction between existence and actuality. The distinction is supposed to enable neoclassical theists to avoid the alleged problem, which Dombrowski takes to be a good one, that the ontological argument deduces something about concrete reality from a mere definition. According to Dombrowski, a neoclassical theist claims that the ontological argument proves no more than the existence of God, and the fact that God exists cannot be used to deduce which properties in particular God has. (Dombrowski does say that whatever attributes God has, we know they are consistent with God's being perfect.) As a result, he claims that God's existence is abstract. God's actuality, on the other hand, is concrete. God's actuality, according to Dombrowski, is how God exists. By how God exists, Dombrowski means which properties or attributes God has as a result of his existing in time in the actual world. Dombrowski doesn't think one can deduce most of God's attributes from an argument because he takes it that God exists in time (another key neoclassical assertion) and in a world that is always changing. God reacts to the world as it continues to change, and so which specific properties God has are contingent ones -- ones based on how the world, and humans in it, change as time progresses. So, according to Dombrowski, although God is perfect (this much we know from the ontological argument), how God's perfection manifests itself is not a matter we can ascertain a priori.

Assuming, for the sake of argument, that the distinction neoclassical theists make is a good one, it is not at all clear how the purported distinction is supposed to escape the problem. The problem with the ontological argument, recall, is supposed to be that merely by considering the concept of God, one sees that God must exist. That is to say that just by analyzing a concept, one can conclude something about how the world actually is. Dombrowski says that because neoclassical theists do not make many claims about which properties God actually has, they do not make any concrete claims about God and thus escape the objection. But a closer examination of his view shows that Dombrowski's own interpretation of the argument yields the same objectionable result, i.e., that on the basis of conceptual analysis we can conclude something about concrete reality. He writes, "Anselm's discovery… was that contingent existence is not compatible with perfection, hence God's existence is either impossible or necessary (89)." Dombrowski falls on the side of believing that the ontological argument shows that God's existence is necessary, and that a necessarily existing being exists in all possible circumstances. Whether one believes that all of God's properties are ones God has necessarily or that some of God's properties are contingent, God, a being, still exists. Just because one doesn't know which properties God has doesn't mean that one isn't immediately committed to God's concrete existence. Moreover, we must know at least something about that being, or the claim that the being exists would be without cognitive content for us. And Dombrowski does apparently say that we know two things about God from the ontological argument: that he exists necessarily, and that he is perfect. Dombrowski's own views entail that if God exists necessarily, God exists concretely, i.e. actually, in all possible circumstances.

Dombrowski's book, while it brings together a host of objections and responses to the ontological argument from across traditional disciplinary boundaries, attempts to solve too many problems in too short a space. The book succeeds in making readers aware that the ontological argument is one that scholars hailing from a wide range of intellectual traditions should take seriously, but fails in defending the neoclassical theists' position as the only one worth holding.