Rethinking the Western Understanding of the Self

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Ulrich Steinvorth, Rethinking the Western Understanding of the Self, Cambridge UP, 2009, 222pp., $26.99 (pbk) ISBN 9780521757072.

Reviewed by Ruth Hagengruber, University of Paderborn, Germany



This book presents a courageous analysis of the philosophical concept of the self and its marked influence on Western history and civilisation. According to Steinvorth, the Cartesian concept of the self is a decisive kernel from which the ideas of freedom of the individual, free will and human rights originate. His argumentation unfolds well and traces the understanding of the self back to the beginnings of Western philosophy, citing some of its most influential representatives on the way. While discussing Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Locke, Kant, Hegel, Freud, Wittgenstein and Hannah Arendt, Steinvorth presents several important concepts of Western reasoning, including individualism, subjectivism, freedom, collectivism and utilitarianism. The book could well be seen as a short introduction to the history of Western philosophy. However, Steinvorth’s analysis does not only look back. While in the first three Parts of the book the concept of the self and its history are discussed in some detail, Parts IV and V extend the discussion to the future and to a global view on values. Although the thesis that the self is the crucial concept of Western civilisation is clearly presented in Steinvorth’s study, it is much more than a comprehensive analysis of the self and its conceptual efficacy in history. Instead of providing a one-dimensional introduction, the book provides a history of opposing concepts, argues along differing viewpoints and discusses several opponents and criticisms. It underlines why the philosophical concepts presented are not only limited to Western culture — an important point to which too little attention is usually paid in contemporary discussion. Culture is a mishmash of elements and influences, be they intellectual, national, or traditional; the philosophical argument presented in this book is consequently not constrained to cultural borders. Not everyone born in the West clings to these values, and not all non-Westerners completely deny them.

In Cartesian philosophy, the self is formed by the individual’s duty to use her judgment to determine who and what she is. In judging, the individual experiences herself. This is of course an act, not only a thought. The continuity of an individual arises through judging, as the result of her free will acting on the world. Although by herself she is part of world and nature, the self is free to accept and to deny the world as it is commoved by it. In this originating act, the self can decide for and against; it is free to judge and to act, even against better reason. In acting, the self makes herself independent of the world, although she is not always aware and conscious of this difference.

For Steinvorth, the Cartesian self becomes a strong argument against materialism and utilitarianism, as well as against pure logical, analytic and deterministic presuppositions, occasionally challenging the compatibilism of Dennett, Frankfurt and others. One of his insights is that thinking is not reducible to logic, because thinking is tied to judging and, as such, it is a form of acting on the world. This also confirms Steinvorth’s rather Archimedian view of Western thinking about the self.

Judging as an act of constitution unveils another dimension of the self. In acting, the passion of self-expression becomes explicit. Reason is passion — and passion is not a contradiction to reason. Reason contradicts desire and greed, but not passion. The goal of self-assertion and the exercise of one’s own capacities are directed toward excellence and immortality. Following Plato, Aristotle, Freud and Hannah Arendt, Steinvorth enlarges the Cartesian concept of the self by revitalising this elementary component as another root of Western civilization and as a cause and integral part of modernity. Again, we are going to accept this argument as Steinvorth shows its strength by sustaining and discussing important objections. Big catastrophes may have been caused by the will for extraordinariness. But this does not mean that only Western civilisations have suffered from debacles and disaster. The claim for the immortality of the individual confronts the insufficiencies and anonymity of closed societies. As Hannah Arendt said, totalitarian movements promise extraordinariness but they dissolve the self. Totalitarian societies are produced by the lack of self-interest of masses that are quite prepared to sacrifice themselves. Giving meaning to the many is usually secured by focusing on their labour. The problem today is that labour can no longer be a functional instrument for the generation of meaning, as the problem of unemployment cannot be solved by job creation programs or higher unemployment benefit.

Where then should we strive for immortality? In Part IV, Steinvorth delineates his idea of a future global society based on what he has identified as the ‘uncheatable’ standard of modernity. This dream of Utopia is built on free will and aims at self realization; it is presented as a world of value spheres.

The concept of the value sphere in fact replaces the strong idea of the state. States lose more and more of their arrogated powers and law becomes independent of the state. If we need justice, we do not necessarily need the state as a political sphere; other institutions might look after public affairs better than the state does. Neither the state’s economy nor politically driven justice is needed. Justice needs enforcement, which should be better executed by independent institutions of legislation, judicature and executions. The economy becomes an important step to the secular understanding of justice, which can in turn be thought of as a value sphere of its own and not only as the task of the state. Thus replacing national and territorial institutions, value spheres could create a model for activities by which individuals can attain extraordinariness. Economic rationality is an instrument to tune divergent inclinations of all members of a society. What we are facing now is the necessity to separate the task of justice from that of administration.

The concept of value spheres presented here as a futuristic political concept is meant to represent institutions as a different way forward and as a realm for the individual to strive for extraordinariness. The value of the sphere is constructed by the actions of individuals and by their ideas of virtue and improvement. Value spheres are defined by giving space to selfish acting and perfecting, and they are therefore rooted in the idea of schooling and improving. The aim is to acquire wanted and useful qualities such as wealth, health, security, justice, education and information, but it is also to strive for science, art, religion, love. There are two realms of action serving and non-serving value spheres. Although these serving value spheres do not have an object in themselves, but are constructed to serve viability and sustenance, they would be senseless (what Steinvorth calls a Sisyphean absurdity) if the sacrifice one has to make in order to execute them were not to pay off eventually. Science, arts, sports and love are all examples of a non-serving sphere; they represent realms of action for the individual which function in themselves and give space to immortality. Beyond the state and our economic constraints, value spheres constitute a universe built upon the values which flow from the self. Within them, differences still have to be bridged, responsibility has to be taken, and problems, of course, remain. Yet the way Steinvorth represents this particular kind of utopia shows that it suffers from a great difficulty: the serving spheres he suggests are not marked by material equality, and only formal justice should drive the non-serving value spheres. It is not easy to understand this twofold concept of formal and material equality at this point, although it certainly represents a good reason for further discussion and clarification.

The last part of the book poses the question of whether the core idea of the self as a core idea of modernity is at all realizable. In our contemporary world, we suffer from extraordinary actions executed by totalitarian movements and terrorism. The concept of the self and its liberal world is open to those who want to abuse it. At a certain point, Steinvorth’s consolation is in its core as old as it is (probably) true: the empowering of the self goes hand in hand with the rise of capabilities and material prosperity. Although this is in fact an Aristotelian insight, it is no less true today.

Steinvorth’s reception of pre-Cartesian philosophy is the one and only critical shortcoming of his thesis. Overall, the study is easily criticized for its historical approach. Insights into historical facts are limited by the very nature of those facts. Steinvorth’s attempt to prove the historical relevance of the concept of the self is therefore audacious. Although he quite often succeeds in convincing his readers, his proposed dating of the ideas of individualism and ethical universalism eventually fails. Steinvorth charges the ancient Greeks with not having developed an ethical universalism since they denied women and slaves civil rights. Yet he dates the breakthrough into modernity partly back to the Old Testament and locates it within Roman philosophy, thereby losing sight of the fact that neither of these were concerned about the rights of women and slaves. The suppression of women and the issue of slavery were not solved in Roman or Jewish antiquity, nor were they finally being dealt with in Descartes’ time. And, it has to be said, the feminist perspective is entirely lacking in Steinvorth’s book.

As strong as these objections are, however, I generally agree with Steinvorth, because besides the shortcomings in relation to the historical facts the book presents, we in fact do find an overwhelming foundation of personal freedom within the Cartesian conception of the self, and this can be appreciated by all human beings, men and women, westerners and easterners, northerners and southerners. The applicability of individual rights is universal, despite the fact that they are not applied universally, neither within Western civilisation nor within this book. There are hundreds and hundreds of amendments and complements to be made. But Steinvorth’s most useful contribution is that he provides a compilation of important thoughts on the intellectual conception of modernity. His is a good book, precisely because he draws our attention not only to the argument he presents, but also to the mistakes inherent to the point of view. And Steinvorth’s is a good book, since it is not only an analysis of the past but also looks to the future.