Rethinking Virtue Ethics

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Michael Winter, Rethinking Virtue Ethics, Springer, 2011, 183pp., $139.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400721920.

Reviewed by Frans Svensson, Stockholm University


Have virtue ethicists underestimated the possibilities of developing a system of ethics that, among other things, could provide us with general moral principles which can be both codified and action-guiding within a basically Aristotelian framework? Have they too casually accepted the view that when it comes to successful deliberation about what we should do in specific situations, Aristotelian virtue ethics entails that rules or principles do not have a particularly important role to play; that what is required is rather a well developed sensitivity, of a kind that is characteristic of the virtuous, which enables its possessors to appreciate reliably the morally salient features on a case by case basis? In Rethinking Virtue Ethics, Michael Winter argues that these questions should be answered in the affirmative.

According to Winter, no Aristotelian could reasonably deny the existence of general moral or ethical principles altogether. Aristotelians should accept, for example, that happiness (eudaimonia) is our final end and that we therefore morally ought to avoid doing anything that is not conducive to our happiness. Furthermore, Aristotelians are, in Winter's account, committed to the view that happiness is, at least in part, constituted by virtuous activity (certain external goods may be needed as well). Failing to do what is virtuous is thus a matter of failing to do what is conducive to our happiness, and we therefore morally ought to avoid failing to do what is virtuous.

However, neither of these prescriptions is particularly helpful when trying to figure out what we should do in particular cases. In order never to fail to do what is virtuous, we must somehow be able to determine what it would be virtuous to do in our particular circumstances, but in many cases it is arguably far from transparent what the virtuous course (or courses) of action might be.[1] Could virtue ethics provide more specific moral principles with greater action-guiding potential? This is the level at which many virtue ethicists indeed do seem to think that, perhaps with the exception of a few examples of types of actions which we must never do (Aristotle famously lists murder, theft and adultery in this category), we will at best be able to come up with various rules or principles which hold, as Aristotle puts it, only for the most part (hos epi to polu). In addition, there is no way in which we could in advance capture all the possible exceptions within more complex formulations of the relevant rules or principles. It is precisely because of this that there is, on this common view, no shortcut to reliably determining what it would be virtuous to do in different situations. What we must do is develop a virtuous character, including the special kind of sensitivity which accompanies the development of such a character. This is also why many virtue ethicists have been critical of the notion of a system (or theory) of ethics, of the kind that at least some forms of consequentialism and deontology aspire to deliver.

According to Winter, however, this reaction is premature. He agrees that "the human situation is certainly far too complex" for it to be "possible to offer anything like a rulebook for the moral life that a person could consult on any occasion to determine what to do" (p. 144). Sound judgment or sensitivity to the morally relevant features of our circumstances is therefore crucial for reliably finding out what it would be virtuous to do. But this, Winter argues, is compatible with there being perfectly general moral principles, even in virtue ethics, which can be both codified and play a significant action-guiding role in our practical deliberations.

Winter's argument for this compatibility rests on a certain technical analysis of how we should understand for the most part qualifications in the context of ethics. His discussion of the proposed analysis, which, among other things, involves trying to show how the analysis fits within -- and gains support from -- Aristotle's overall philosophical framework, is quite intricate, and it is impossible for me to delve into the specifics here. To illustrate briefly how it is supposed to work, however, consider the principle "Repaying debts should be done for the most part", a principle which intuitively seems closely associated with the virtue of justice.[2] According to the analysis developed by Winter, the "for the most part" clause in this principle indicates that "there is a necessary relation involved between the subject, repayment of debt, and the capacity or dunamis for the [attribute]" (p. 133). The idea is that it is a necessary part -- perhaps part of the nature or essence -- of the subject (in this case the repayment of debt) that it has the capacity (dunamis) for being such that it should be done. However, whether this capacity is actualized or realized in a particular case depends on (i) the absence of different kinds of impediments which may be either internal or external to the subject, and (ii) the presence of an appropriate efficient cause, a cause "which may be the thing's nature" itself (p. 88). If (i) and (ii) are fulfilled, then the capacity will be (indeed, cannot fail to be) realized in the particular case. In light of this, Winter suggests that the principle "Repaying debts should be done for the most part" can be transformed into "Repaying debts should be done unless impediments are present", a principle which (assuming, I take it, that the efficient cause in this case is the thing's or subject's nature itself) holds without exception and which is also codifiable, even though it may not be possible to state in advance all the different kinds of situations in which impediments are indeed present:

the unless-clause should be understood quite generally. Comprehending this proposition involves understanding what the subject and predicate are, and understanding that the essence of each brings with it the possibility that the predicate will not apply to the subject in every set of circumstances. We need not know anything about the specific circumstances under which this could happen to know that something about the essence of the subject and predicate would allow for such circumstances (p. 134).

Furthermore, this principle (and other principles of the same kind) can play a significant role in practical reasoning, according to Winter. If we assume that a person X has a debt to another person Y, then X could use this principle as the major premise in a practical syllogism and, together with a minor premise based on his or her particular circumstances, deduce "a prescription about how to act" (ibid.). The syllogism might look like this (ibid.):

Repaying debts should be done unless impediments are present.

Impediments are not present.


This debt should be paid.

This still leaves ample room for the importance of virtue or virtuous sensitivity, since such sensitivity is required in order to determine reliably whether impediments are in fact present or not. No pre-designed formula could ever, as it were, replace virtuous sensitivity as a guide to determine that.

Now, setting aside whatever questions could be raised with respect to Winter's proposed analysis of for the most part qualifications, one may wonder whether the kind of principles that he seems to think might play a significant action-guiding role in virtue ethics can really be action-guiding for anyone but the already virtuous. After all, in the picture sketched above, virtue or virtuous sensitivity is indeed required in order to appreciate reliably whether impediments are present or not with respect to the application of the relevant principles. But what if I have not yet been able to develop much of a virtuous sensitivity and I don't have a virtuous role model in my vicinity to ask for help? How should go about determining what I should do in particular cases? Winter states explicitly that "part of the purpose of offering an ethical theory is to put a person in a position to be capable of determining what he/she ought to do in the absence of a role model", and that "it seems like a good ethical theory . . . will be useful and possibly necessary in some cases for a person who is striving to lead a good life" (p. 144). It remains unclear to me, however, how Winter thinks that his own form of Aristotelian virtue ethics meets these (alleged) conditions on a good ethical theory. In light of the importance virtuous sensitivity still has in his theory, one might think that the theory retains the kind of elitist aura that some have argued surrounds virtue ethics.[3]

Nevertheless, Rethinking Virtue Ethics contains many interesting and important discussions of different topics relating to virtue ethics. Especially, the discussions about how we might understand for the most part qualifications in ethics and about the role that principles should reasonably play within a virtue ethical framework seem to me deserving of further consideration. It must be said, though, that some parts of the book remain rather sketchy. To my mind, this is particularly the case with chapter 4, which concerns how we might gain knowledge of moral principles, and the short discussion towards the end of the book about the possibility of making room for inalienable rights within virtue ethics. Furthermore, a regrettable feature of the book -- not least because of its title -- is that there is very little engagement with the work of other contemporary virtue theorists besides John McDowell (and Winter is in fact engaging only with one of McDowell's papers on ethics). There are no references at all to, e.g., Julia Annas, Elizabeth Anscombe, Philippa Foot or Alasdair MacIntyre; not even to Rosalind Hursthouse, whose views about the role of rules or principles in virtue ethics have been very influential. This is a pity, I think, for at least two reasons. First of all, it would have been interesting to see how Winter thinks his position is related to the positions of these other authors. Secondly, I suspect that the failure to engage with the work of other influential virtue theorists will increase the risk that Winter's book is passed by in the flood of papers and books which are currently being published on virtue ethics.[4]



Driver, J. (2001): Uneasy Virtue, Cambridge University Press

Schneewind, J.B. (1997): "The Misfortunes of Virtue", in Virtue Ethics (eds. R. Crisp and

M. Slote), Oxford University Press

Simpson, P. (1997): "Contemporary Virtue Ethics and Aristotle", in Virtue Ethics -- A

Critical Reader (ed. D. Statman), Edinburgh University Press

[1] I say "course (or courses)" just to leave open the possibility of cases in which there are several virtuous courses of action available.

[2] Winter uses this principle as an example on p. 133f.

[3] Objections from elitism against virtue ethics can be found in, e.g., Driver (2001), Schneewind (1997), and Simpson (1997).

[4] I wish to thank Jens Johansson and Jonas Olson for their comments on a previous draft of this review.