Retrieving Realism

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Hubert Dreyfus and Charles Taylor, Retrieving Realism, Harvard University Press, 2015, 171pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967519.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California-Santa Cruz


Death does not always still certain voices nor end some conversations. As Feyerabend wrote of Lakatos in his "Preface" to Against Method, that book represents "a letter to a friend and addresses his idiosyncrasies." Hubert Dreyfus and Charles Taylor similarly address this book to a dearly missed interlocutor, Richard Rorty. (ix) Indeed, Retrieving Realism replays in many of its particulars a (literal) conversation between them in The Review of Metaphysics (1980), 34:39-55. (Cited herein as RM) There Dreyfus, Taylor, and Rorty concur in rejecting any mediational picture of knowledge -- the mind as the "mirror of nature." And while Dreyfus and Taylor engage a multitude of themes and philosophers (living and dead) in their book, they remain in most active dialogue with Rorty, and in that spirit their book must be read.

Surely a defining mark of philosophical discussion in the twentieth century concerns just those powerful voices that question the whole enterprise as traditionally conceived. Dreyfus and Taylor from their opening pages look to engage chronic nay-sayers such as Quine. But they respond most specifically to a characteristically Rortyian take on these themes.

I shall be arguing for the uselessness of the Diltheyan notion of a "method of the human sciences." More specifically, I shall be arguing against the attempts of Professors Dreyfus and Taylor to preserve the opposition between the natural and the human sciences and thus to give sense to the Diltheyan notion. . . . the demise of logical empiricism means that there is no interesting split between the Natur- and the Geisteswissenschaften. (Rorty, RM 39)

So while Dreyfus and Taylor promote realism as they configure it, the larger argument of this book -- and its ongoing engagement with Rorty -- concerns philosophy's place in overcoming an epistemological and metaphysical tradition.

The sense of "realism" at issue can be quickly gleaned from the fact that the first two chapters reproduce portions of Dreyfus's exchange with John McDowell. (Chapter Four replays as well the issues between the authors and McDowell.) They do and McDowell does not want to retain a philosophical role for the "preconceptual." Dreyfus and Taylor look to provide a philosophical account of how humans come to be embedded in the world that simultaneously underwrites pride of place to a world preconceptually apprehended by humans, interpretatively dependent on them, and yet still fully open to unproblematic determination by the natural sciences. Most importantly, only a philosophy so imagined will be able to play what they take to be an absolutely needed role of re-enchanting reality. "We are divided beings needing to be healed. The objective instrumental stance towards nature makes communion with it, or a sense of inclusion in it, impossible." (26) (See especially Chapter Two for a rehash of the main lines of critique.) Many gods have failed us. Now philosophy has its chance to show the way to salvation.

If Rorty really is a religious, practical hermeneuticist, then what he cares about is salvation; that is, he cares about keeping in touch with the practices that have made us what we are and to which the disciplinary society cannot do justice. It's a question not of life or death but, more seriously, of salvation or damnation. That's the only language for it that I know. (Dreyfus, RM 51)

The authors now put the difference between them and Rorty this way:

For Rorty we escape from "the collapsed circus tent of epistemology" . . . mainly by getting rid of certain traditional distinctions and questions, like, for instance, the scheme/content way of talking, or the issue of correspondence with reality; while we think that these questions and distinctions have to be recast. (41)

As will come as no surprise to anyone already familiar with their work, key to their recasting are notions such as "motor intentionality" (Merleau-Ponty's term) or "absorbed coping" (Dreyfus's preferred formulation). A fundamental point concerns their claim that explanations of how humans succeed in doing what they do ultimately cannot be further explicated conceptually or explained by (reduced to) causal relations. "Ordinary coping isn't conceptual. But at the same time, it can't be understood in just inanimate-causal terms." (51) At 51, fn. 27 they write, "Neuroscience has established that procedural coping ability is produced by a system of brain areas centered on the subcortical basal ganglia". The use of 'produced' here signals the physiological groundedness of coping practices, but not in a way that delimits or determines an etiology. As they also like to put matters, human representational abilities necessarily presuppose a prior non-causal, non-representational engagement with the world. (e.g., 52, 62) "Our explicit thinking about the world is contextualized and given its sense by an implicit, largely unarticulated background sense of our being in the world." (67; see also 69) On their view, this establishes preconceptual coping as brute, and so puts humans forever beyond the reach of instrumental reason. (103)

Despite passing swipes at Rorty, Quine, and Davidson, Chapters Two to Five challenge "the centrality of mental representations to knowledge" (106), a position that none of those just named subscribe to in any case. A better sense of the book's purpose emerges finally in Chapter Six. For unlike Rorty, Dreyfus and Taylor retain a very specific philosophical connection to traditional epistemology insofar as they take the threat of some form of skepticism seriously. "The reality of contact with the real world is the inescapable fact of human (or animal) life, and can only be imagined away by erroneous philosophical argument." (107) So the issue seems to be this. Rorty (inter alia) imagines that accounts of the hold that "the world" has on beings like us can go no deeper than what systematic probing by social and ultimately scientific endeavors allow.

Why not, in short, just give the notions of "knowledge" and "objectivity" and "science" to the Weberians and the reductionists, and stop trying to hold on to terms which only look honorific because they are associated with ability to predict and control? We might as well just admit that the easiest way to predict and control a person is to reduce him to a thing -- a point familiar to rookies in the KGB -- and that the notions of control and cognition have been inseparable since the days of Bacon and Galileo. (Rorty, RM 44-45)

The key question then concerns what Dreyfus and Taylor take to be at stake when they insist on the reality of contact with the real world. Exactly to what sense of reality and real do they appeal and Rorty et al. reject?

Chapter Six however does not address these questions. Rather, it counterposes two contrasting notions of sense-making/translation -- Gadamer's and Davidson's. The latter they read as one of imposing a rationality constraint on translation, so that others (or Others) come out believing more or less as we do. Against this, Dreyfus and Taylor insist that "Our different worlds are linguistically constituted, but our languages are responding to something, trying to articulate something in the human condition." (128) This they identify as "a more general capacity, which can never be totally lost, to be inducted into one or another particular variant of the human meanings." (129) Yet they acknowledge that this way of cutting the difference between them and Davidson represents primarily "a kind of humanist faith." (129)

"As a good pragmatist, I want to replace the notion of 'discovery of essence' with that of 'appropriateness of a vocabulary for a purpose.' This will enable us to do everything we could do before, except continue the Western metaphysical tradition." (Rorty, RM 46)

But only on the very last page of Chapter Six do Dreyfus and Taylor veer back to their earlier announced realism. And just here they declare that ultimately they adopt what they term a "plural realism." (130) Chapter Seven, "Realism Retrieved," assumes the burden of this argument. For now they seek to distinguish between what they term Rorty's deflationary realism and their own "that claims that, to understand the status of the structures studied by natural science, we have to make sense of an independent reality." (132) But throughout they struggle with Rorty's challenge to make coherent a sense of a reality viewed from nowhere.

it seems to me that the notion that part of our language is more "absolute" than other parts is a survival of sixteenth-century pre-Galilean notions. When nature was believed to be planned by God, or when nature itself was personalized -- thought of as ourselves blown up to macrocosmic scale, or as the author of a Book which we were trying to interpret -- it made some sense to think that bits of our vocabulary were more "natural" than others. These were the bits where our vocabulary overlapped the vocabulary in which nature described herself to herself, or in which God thought when he was figuring out how to manifest himself. But once God is lost and nature mechanized, the suggestion that there is a "natural" or "absolute" vocabulary makes no sense. (Rorty, RM 42)

To overcome such questions, they appeal to a notion that they term supersession, one that will be more familiar to philosophers of science from debates about theoretical convergence or verisimilitude. Dreyfus and Taylor characterize supersession in both a psychological and pragmatic way. On the psychological side, they insist that once one experiences a scientific revolution, one literally cannot return thinking in terms of the previous paradigm. "Once you've been through the transition [e.g., from Aristotelian to Galilean-Newtonian mechanics] . . . you can't rationally go back; that is, you can't return without forgetting some of the things you've learned. There is supersession here." (68) Unfortunately, as a psychological claim this certainly seems false. The world remains stocked with individuals happy to accept the practical results of later theories while embracing supposedly superseded, e.g., Biblical, accounts of why things are as they are. Moreover, Dreyfus and Taylor do not limit themselves here to strictly scientific cases. "But think of the reasons offered against giving women the vote when they were still struggling for it. How many of them could be repeated today with a straight face?" (68) Alas, evidence does not clearly underwrite their optimistic assessment.

A conviction that it must make sense to speak of an "independent structure of reality" and their appreciation of the metaphysical and epistemological impasses that bedevil attempts to do so makes their frustration palpable.

Clearly, the universe has some independent structure and we embodied being have to get in the right relation to that structure in order to experience anything, but if we can only describe how these boundary conditions affect us embodied beings, we are still stuck in internal realism. . . . But if we can't break out, Rorty and the deflationary realists are right (139).

Subsequent appeals to the bare logical possibility of "true theories" corresponding to "an independently existing universe" (147) only gives voice to a picture that holds them in its thrall.

Later characterizations of supersession appear to adhere strictly to natural scientific cases and utilize appeals to improved reliability and predictive power. Yet they offer no discussion of, e.g., Kuhn on incommensurability or Laudan on pessimistic induction. So it comes as a surprise when two such knowledgeable thinkers simply declare "that scientific revolutions are cases of supersession. If they are not immediately accepted it is because the older view is entrenched, not because they are not rationally motivated." (144; see also 146) Yet, they also grudgingly acknowledge, deflationary realists can still stand their ground in the face of such "practical" considerations. (146)

Chapter Eight, the final one, begins with the authors quickly backpedalling from any seeming endorsement of Kripke-style essentialism (scouted in their previous chapter). These concessions make it increasingly difficult to see what separates their robust realism and the much dreaded Rortyian alternative. These worries gain particular force when Dreyfus and Taylor acknowledge that their notion of essential properties proves "essential only relative to our way of questioning nature so as to reveal its independent properties. The [ancient] Egyptians might well have revealed properties of gold only accessible through their religious practices." (151) But what became of supersession? The psychological version of the argument reappears. "Given our understanding of supersession, we claim that we could, at least in principle, have taught the ancient Egyptians our science, and with it the distinction between the 'in itself' and the 'for us.'" (152) But having earlier dismissed Davidson's primacy of any rationally grounded principle of charity, it becomes difficult to unpack what the "in principle" claim to be able to so translate between cultures comes to. Indeed, if contemporary creationists can refuse "our science" and still navigate about the world, why not ancient Egyptians?

One cannot accuse Dreyfus and Taylor of avoiding hard questions. They admit that

we can agree with Rorty that there is no one language for correctly describing nature, while holding, contra Rorty, that there could well be many languages each correctly describing a different aspect of reality. Our position could then be characterized as pluralistic robust realism. (154)

With no hint of irony they add, "It is obvious that we are proposing a position which is going to be difficult to defend". (154) And despite their concessions to ancient Egyptians and the like, they nonetheless take their main challenge not to be philosophical; their confidence in supersession remains unshaken. Rather, they see themselves as bucking a certain cultural tide, one that must "leave open the possibility that there is no single way the universe works." (158)

I want to give a very high-toned sense to "conversation." The paradigm context for my sense of the term is the famous essay of Michael Oakeshott, "The Voice of Poetry in the Conversation of Mankind." If you think of the conversation of mankind not as chat, but as standing for the whole human enterprise -- culture, if you like -- then "conversation" is a perfectly reasonable word for what we do to be saved. It does connect up with salvation. Indeed, it strikes me that precisely this is the interesting difference between Dewey and Heidegger. Heidegger decides that, since the Nazis didn't work out, only a God can save us now. Dewey, it seems to me, is saying: No, neither something like the Nazis, nor something like the descent of the spirit, but just conversation. That is, just us on our own. (Rorty, RM 52)

Opposing as they do the thought that social hope comes to no more than Rortyian conversation, Dreyfus and Taylor hold out a prospect for a "positive answer," one that "takes the form of trying to show that our science supports the Christian view of a human-centered universe." (158) And although the later Alasdair MacIntyre or early Peter Winch receive no mention, Dreyfus and Taylor maintain that whole cultures and not just theories in the natural sciences can be subject to supersession. (162-3) Their optimism on this point can hardly be overstated. "We can see . . . [that] a possible global consensus on human rights could be building in our world." (164; see also 166, 167) But the last word does not always go to the living.

RORTY: I would want to disjoin the notion that a focus and a paradigm is needed from the notion that it is the task of philosophy to give it to us.

DREYFUS: No, that's the way God comes in; it is not the task of philosophy.

RORTY: Yes, but there ought to be a middle ground between philosophy professors and God.

DREYFUS: Who, for instance?

RORTY: I have no idea. (RM 54)