Return Statements: The Return of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Gregg Lambert, Return Statements: The Return of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 247pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474413916.

Reviewed by Colby Dickinson, Loyola University Chicago


Various contemporary continental philosophers have taken an interest in espousing some form of a 'return to religion' but one devoid of actual, material religious belief and practice (e.g.,  John Caputo's 'religion without religion' or Jean-Luc Nancy's 'deconstruction of Christianity)'. But actual, empirical religion, post-9/11, has been flourishing in our globalized world, where belief and religion are not devoid of their meaning, permanently cancelled out philosophically, as it were, but are as loaded as ever with the charge of tradition and sense. This is the context wherein Gregg Lambert develops his notion of the 'return statement'. The latter phrase, appropriated from computer programming, indicates the exit from a particular subroutine, i.e., something like a paradigm shift in philosophical terms.  Lambert invokes it in order to indicate contemporary continental philosophy's desire to leave behind the various embodied religious forms we see before us every day in its own, more abstracted 'return to religion' that would serve perhaps to cancel out the religious altogether.

The problem with contemporary philosophical accounts, in Lambert's analysis, is that they are too beholden to those deconstructive, negative theological accounts of representation that would see a specific ontology crossed-out but not replaced by anything with its own ontological substance. There is therefore a lack of an ontological form that arises in the face of these various philosophical 'fundamentalisms' that he is keen to frequently critique. In essence, there are too few actual commitments to actual persons, communities, bodies or 'life itself' -- all terms that Lambert sees taken up in abstract philosophical terms without actually invoking their all-too-real material counterparts. If we have witnessed philosophically the 'return of religion', then what kind of religion are we talking about if not an actually embodied, 'material religion'? What new philosophical fundamentalism is being adhered to in this movement? Lambert's book, which is really a collection of essays and talks given over the course of a decade, seek with a 'Voltaire-like acerbic tone' along with some 'Swiftian satire' (p. 12) to undermine the paradigm dominant at the moment in contemporary continental thought. Following Foucault's efforts to critique modernity's flawed but persistent attempt to escape from every system or tradition, Lambert wishes 'simply to test the validity of each "return" against my own human, inevitably "all too human," experience of our shared contemporary reality' (p. 17).

The first chapter takes up Foucault's reading of Kant on the Enlightenment, a direct attempt to 'dare to know' (sapere aude) the limits of our knowledge. The present ethos, Lambert states, is one marked by a fear of thinking critically in this sense: 'I would dare to venture that historical periods marked by an increase in utopian social thought [his phrase for the entirely negative, deconstructive tone in contemporary philosophy], in lieu of the invention of concrete political practices, can be understood in some way as epochal manifestations of discouragement' (p. 21). He then provides brief accounts of (a) the removal of theory from practice, which he finds to be justified to some degree in university discourse, (b) contemporary biopolitics, and (c) permanent critiques of the modern Subject and essentialism contrasted with a quest for 'the thing itself' beyond any forms of representation. In all of this, we find a solid defense of the logic of emancipation and autonomy that stemmed from the Enlightenment, which has not been taken seriously enough in practical and political terms, but which is taken more seriously than ever by those postcolonial subjects who stand up to colonial accounts that would excise them from their narratives of power.

What Lambert directs us toward is how, rather than 'permanently critique' our autonomy, 'we need to find something positive and affirmative on the other side, as in a completely different knowledge of ourselves' (p. 31). Rather than assume (or believe, in Lambert's phrasing) that we will have to adopt a 'critical theory' that ends in nihilistic despair from the start, one that knows where it is headed before it begins the quest, can we adopt a more positive openness to whatever questioning we are led to engage? In order to 'dare to know' the limits of his own thinking, Lambert proposes, to himself, 'to actually risk believing in nothing' (p. 36). Though he invokes this risk so that he might avoid the philosophical fundamentalism he is set on critiquing, how this step avoids the very problematic of becoming its own permanent critical theory that merely repeats those strategies he is averse to, I am not entirely sure.

The second chapter takes up a case study of sorts in directly addressing the work of John Caputo whose own efforts to 'return to religion' are fairly indicative of the point of view that Lambert wishes to challenge. His comments on Caputo are preceded by a short meditation on the nature of loving and of being loved, but also on a love 'that is infinitely divided within itself, contradictory, admitting in its heart a very profound sense of ambivalence' (p. 44) -- a love then that is willing to kill what it loves out of love for it (such as with Abraham's sacrifice of Isaac, which is indirectly recalled here). Lambert's immediate reaction to Caputo's most basic claims about trying to locate a love that cannot be contained within any historical, institutionalized religious tradition, is that, in doing so through an approach that would bracket both 'love' and 'God', Caputo leaves out the possibility of such a violence being done in the name of love. Does this act, Lambert wonders, repeat the word's original meaning or jettison it completely? He charges Caputo with avoiding the necessity of obligation, while concealing demands within what appears to be a non-demanding injunction, of confusing the Good with love. Lambert prefers more psychoanalytic accounts of love, such as found in Lacan or even Spinoza, who detect something very much 'not good' at work in our demand for love, and which is, he claims, absent in Caputo's account. He speculates that 'Perhaps the Love of God should be weak and nonconstraining in order to prevent hatred from entering into the world from the same source [the Good]' (p. 54), though such an account does not take stock of the darkened sacrifices that this God seemingly demands of us.

Lambert's hat is thrown in with Bataille and Lacan on this score; jealousy, possession and fear are always mixed in with our love, he contests, and this very human nature of love becomes, at times, a form of self-hatred in love that rivals the mystics who did a certain violence to themselves in order to draw closer to God. This is fundamentally the 'inherent contradiction in Christianity': that 'God so loved the world that he tortured and murdered his beloved object' (p. 56). The fact that such a view is, theologically-speaking, highly suspect today as a suitable atonement theory (the work of René Girard comes to mind), does not, however, enter into Lambert's point of view. In some sense, then, Lambert does not really address Caputo's claims, but draws up a general psychoanalytic plea for taking this 'dark God', which may be a straw God in the end standing in for the violence humanity does to itself in the name of God, more seriously. Lambert may have a point here in some sense, but whether this is what Caputo is after may be something quite different.

The third chapter, 'Noli me tangere!', develops an extended and original commentary on Nancy's so-called 'antinomy of the body', the permanent tension that resides in us between our physical bodies and the symbolic, or spiritual, body which Christianity has played upon with such significance throughout its history. Indeed, Christianity seems to have combined ('incarnated') death, life and God into the idea of the body itself. Reading the resurrection stories involving the bodily reactions of Mary Magdalene to Jesus, Lambert discusses how Christianity's ambivalence about the human body created a division between inclusion and exclusion that still haunts 'every representation of the "political body" today' (p. 81). Though he omits certain strong counter-narratives to this reading, including those put forth by Badiou and Agamben in their political-theological rereadings of Pauline thought, which insist on the radical liberatory praxis of Paul's philosophy (in line with the feminism that Lambert praises even), he does begin to lean into the main course (and force) of the book's argumentation, which will unfold in the chapters that follow.

Chapter Four, which again follows Nancy and Derrida on the issue of touch, turns to the recent explicit use of Christian ideas within phenomenological investigation -- its allegedly 'theological turn'. Lambert reads Derrida to see whether or not these theological elements, a 'Christian thinking of the flesh', were present in the earlier 'anthropocentric' phenomenology of Husserl and Heidegger. What he finds is a Christian imposition of its reading of the body upon the actual, human body, something that can be discerned in the contrast between Derrida and Nancy on the role of Christian ideas in a proper phenomenological method. Lambert is convinced that Nancy has departed from the phenomenological altogether, whereas Derrida remains skeptical and vigilant (as does Lambert) about any phenomenological movements. Christianity, in its attempt to outdo the anthropocentrism of humanism, merely redoubles its efforts, producing a theological critique of the body (and of mourning) that only further removes human beings from their existential, ontological situation. Any onto-theology, in this sense, is a contradictio in terminis, as no theology could support a genuine ontology: 'To have faith means to be able to ontically overcome a pre-Christian existential comportment' (p. 105). Hence, we find the Christian focus, he claims, on the 'fetish' of Christ's body (p. 97).

Lambert next further explores his critique of 'philosophical fundamentalism', first by reading Heidegger's establishment of a strict line between theology and philosophy (faith as a reaction against 'bare life', a theme already explored in the book), thus denying any 'Christian philosophy' its existence, but then, second, by demonstrating how the 'return to religion', or Nancy and Caputo's versions of a 'Christian deconstructionism', fails to be faithful to Derrida's original project of deconstruction. In this, Lambert, again, positions himself as the least naïve Derridean, hoping not for a return to some previous site, but for a future that takes the complexity of life more seriously than it previously has. The 'death of God' theologians, and 20th century theologians in general, in many ways succumbed to a path of Christian deconstructionism and critical theory that Lambert is seeking to move beyond.

Chapter Six presents Derrida's reading of the 'return of religion' as a globalized, financial movement, a 'globalatinization' that has inscribed an ultimately hollow, ephemeral concept of 'the religious', upon things it designates according to a quasi-imperial decree and its claim of sovereignty over other forms of life, including cultural life, or even 'biopolitical life' (p. 143). What this Christianized, globalatinized form of religion does for us today is actually to preempt any genuinely developing sense of the religious from taking place today: 'Is there either space or time for us to imagine the coming of a new Christ, much less a new Paul; a new Buddha or Krishna' (pp. 146-147)? The mystery of real life is omitted precisely through the imposition of a sovereign religious form; hence, we encounter the 'death of God' in another sense altogether from how many have imagined it. It is the 'return of religion' in (late) modernity that eradicates God at the same time as it seems to champion God most -- a point that underscores the contemporary context of Lambert's study.

Chapter Seven investigates Badiou's return to Paul specifically in relation to Levinas' formulations of alterity. This chapter is particularly interesting insofar as it finds a way to align Levinas' 'I-you' coupling to the political 'friend-enemy' distinction (C. Schmitt) and to critique Badiou's use of Pauline thought as a form of universalization of the subject as that which takes place, again, in an abstracted, vacuum-like space. For the subject to be truly universalized -- and here Lambert is again demonstrating his fidelity to Foucault -- there must be an apparatus (such as the Roman Empire in the case of Christianity) which universally proclaims the subject. Without such a recognition of the accompanying political machinery, Badiou's aims fall squarely into the category of a 'philosophical fundamentalism' which Lambert has been so attentive to throughout this study.

The eighth chapter critiques the various, ephemeral and abstract notions of the 'coming community' put forth by Nancy in his readings of Bataille. We can locate here Lambert's critique of the utopian ideals of surrealism and 'literary communism' which trade in the realm of abstracted 'critical theory', the yearning for a 'negative community' such as the Romantics once pined for, but which cannot be achieved in practical, ontological terms. Lambert reflects on the relationship of writing and community, and hence, of Christianity's privileging of 'the Word' over established human, social and political relations. He finds too a 'fundamental bias' inscribed in Christianity that recurs again and again: 'this relationship between "the Word" and "the Community" is a bias inscribed in the Christianized West'; it is also 'an alibi or diversion invented by a particular notion of community that absolutely refuses the death of the individual and thus the loss of the demand of community itself' (p. 195). To follow this Christianized return to religion is thus also to be removed from any real community, or even humanity (the Life that he is after). Brought out in Maurice Blanchot's critique of Nancy is the question of a community that forms itself around the death of the individual (hence its focus on mourning), a mythological premise that, Lambert claims, often goes unpronounced and runs the risk of promoting a mystical notion of community that, because founded on the death of the individual, contains no actual individuals.

One question that lingers for me at the end of these provocative essays is: if Lambert is so eager to make his return statement, his exit, from the contemporary 'return to religion' because it merely deconstructs existing ontologies, but produces nothing ontologically substantive of its own, what is to be gained by 'out deconstructing' the master deconstructivists, but producing no ontology of one's own? Can the irony of a present-day Voltaire be enough to undo the myriad 'return statements' that we have before us? Or, more to the point, can simply presenting us with an unconceptualized notion of 'Life', or even 'bare life', be enough to overcome the stranglehold of subjectivity that lies upon us? And, further, how does such an effort deviate from Agamben's own work, which runs strikingly parallel to this endeavor?

Lambert focuses his conclusions on trying to isolate a notion of Life that is in 'perpetual discontinuity with itself' (p. 228) and which will 'always remain conceptually incoherent' (p. 216). Following Foucault closely on this, he describes how philosophy, or 'theory' as he has pursued it, is really an 'epochal signification' (p. 214), engaged in the processes of constructing the very concepts it claims only to speak about. If this is the case, as he suggests, we have recently been witness to the (re)formation of the religious, which, in its very 'return' to us, was created as a stopgap for the problem of subjectivity. The notion of critique, whether theological in origin or not, however, I would claim, cannot simply be dismissed as an abstraction from reality. The space of thought is what perhaps preserves humanity from forms of political dominance that are precisely founded upon notions of sovereign actuality. If this is the case, perhaps Lambert is making a very significant point about what these 'returns to religion' are truly missing, though perhaps he, too, also misses something important about the nature of thought itself in the end.