Return to Nature? An Ecological Counterhistory

Placeholder book cover

Fred Dallmayr, Return to Nature? An Ecological Counterhistory, The University Press of Kentucky, 2011, 216pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 978081313438.

Reviewed by Lenny Moss, University of Exeter


Titles (and subtitles) of books surely have a proper role to play in the forging of felicitous unions between readers and writers (and the eschewing of the infelicitous). One has to imagine that the marketing department had a bit too much influence on this one (let alone the unsustainable reference to "sustainability" in the University of Kentucky's one sentence on-line catalog description). This is not a work in the theory or history of an empirical science, i.e., ecology, nor a work in the philosophy of ecology (even granting 'ecology' a wider berth), nor even a work in some kind of applied philosophy with an ecological aim. The good news however is that it is a work which can help to inform many and to even inspire some. More aptly described, Dallmayr's book is a work in metaphysics or perhaps even better stated -- the history of a particular strain of metaphysics.

Dallmayr's point of departure is the idea that the early-modern dualist separation of nature and spirit was central to setting us on the course that has gotten us into the environmental fix we find ourselves in and that only a holistic metaphysics, in which mind/spirit and an active/productive nature have been reunited, can possibly enable us to climb out. The good news is that there is a story, or counter-story, to tell about modern philosophy beginning with Spinoza that shows that there have been those on the right track all along. Why the anti-dualists/anti-reductionist strains hadn't prevailed is not a question that Dallmayr addresses. Nor, for that matter, does he address the sticky larger question: to what extent a metaphysics, any metaphysics, determines an historical trajectory independent of the whole ensemble of economic, political, sociological, cultural and psychological states of affairs that still only partially characterize the determining forces of an era.  It is, however, at least arguable that a new or renewed metaphysics, permitting and indeed militating towards at least a consilient relationship of humans with our larger 'natural' context, could be a necessary, even if far from sufficient, part of what (if anything) can save global humanity from impending environmental disasters. For those poised to partake of this battle (i.e., those who are young enough, smart enough and honest enough to see no alternative), Dallmayr has something distinctive and distinctively valuable to offer. The ability to even provide an entrée into the reconstruction of an entire philosophical legacy for the sake of the needs and possibilities of the present (and present future) is no mean feat. Fred Dallmayr doing what he does best is Fred Dallmayr handily and concisely making the fruits of a lifetime of engaged erudition serviceable to the many.

The bulk of the text consists of a series of mostly chronologically ordered accounts, which attempt to simultaneously achieve two objectives, to do justice to the basic orientation and trajectory of each thinker's oeuvre but to do so in a way that foreground's the sense in which each contributes to the possibility of a post-dualistic, post-reductionist legacy that Dallmayr strives to bequeath to us. Of course none of these thinkers, with the possible exception of Heidegger, are driven by environmental concerns, and so it will be left to the reader to bring this legacy to bear on shaping the possibilities of the present and future. The mainstream of the text consists of directed reconstructions of Spinoza, Schelling, Schlegel, Novalis, Hölderlin, Wordsworth, Coleridge, Emerson, Thoreau, Dewey, Merleau-Ponty, and Heidegger. This is followed by a synoptic account of Asian philosophy, a tribute to the 'eco-theologian' Thomas Berry, and finally "some personal reflections" on the recovery of philosophical anthropology and the prospects for a return of a "chastened humanism".

While Dallmayr raises the topic of philosophical anthropology, far more as an afterthought than a final word, with a hint even of apology suggested by the personalizing of his interest, one might wonder whether a critical anthropological optic might not have been just the right medicine for turning his inquiry into something more protracted and dynamic than what otherwise can teeter at the edge of being read as a series of historical vignettes? If indeed there is no greater service philosophy can provide the cause of environmental salvation than overcoming its dichotomized metaphysical residues of mindful subjects prevailing over and upon natural objects then who better to turn to the likes of Plessner and Gehlen? Who could better begin to grasp human mindfulness in the vocabulary of a biology, albeit a biology in which nature is no longer just congeries of mechanisms but rather once again also a natura naturans -- a dynamic productive nature in which the possibilities of freedom and reflectiveness are always already immanent? That the anthropologies of Gehlen and Plessner were not about the 'unity of the subject' but rather highlighted the nature-based deficits and eccentric positionality of the human have not spared them from disciplinary exclusion by anti-anthropocentric crusaders marching under the flags of Derrida and Foucault. For Dallmayr, it is first of all the dangers of anti-humanism issuing into an in-humanism that now counsels the recovery of a 'chastened humanism.' Presumably, and at least retrospectively in the spirit of recent philosophical anthropology, Dallmayr's historico-metaphysical reconstruction is also meant as a contribution to the possibility of such a 'chastened humanism.'

Chapter 1 is entitled "Nature and Divine Substance: Spinoza". Situated at the cusp of traditional metaphysics and modern science, Spinoza can also be seen as seeking a rapprochement, a union of 'mind with the whole of nature' (15), between Descartes' rationalist quest for an epistemically secure method and Aristotle's eudaemonistic quest for the means to a good life. In uniting God and Nature, mind and extension become merely different attributes of one and the same substance. When we know ourselves to be part of the all of Nature, then even our emotional striving to be, to exist and flourish, when purged of base distractions through reflective clarity, becomes an immanent pathway toward the virtuous life. Spinoza's metaphysics make it possible for pleasure to be the sentient pleasure of Self, Nature and God all at once. What is left problematic in Spinoza's thinking is the place left for particularity within the totality. In a brief epilogue, Leibniz's introduction of 'monads' is taken up and discussed as Leibniz's way of restoring particularity to the holism of Spinoza substance.

Chapter 2 is entitled "Nature and Spirit: Schelling". The hallmark of Schelling's philosophical progression was that of a movement from an idealist philosophy to one that endeavors to locate consciousness within the evolving and productive forces of nature yet without losing the insights into the impetus toward freedom that idealism bequeathed to 'spirit'. Dallmayr focuses on the expressions and transformations of Schelling's thinking between 1796 and 1802, the principal years during which he was formulating his philosophy of nature. Since a model of explanatory causality that gives priority to either 'the thing' or 'the idea' can be philosophically adequate, the remaining possibility is one of an original organic unity in which the interplay of forces give rise to both non-human and human natures, so that 'Nature should be seen as visible spirit, spirit as visible nature'(39). Further in his Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature, Schelling, drawing on his own encounters with the sciences, seeks to elaborate on the productive forces and processes of nature, but this falls beyond the scope of Dallmayr's work.

It is for Schelling the job of a speculative physics, pace idealism, to derive the ideal from the real, to show "the embeddedness or inherence of the infinite in the finite" (42). In his slightly laterSystem of Transcendental Idealism (1800) Schelling grapples with the problem of how the intellect can come to know the harmony of subject and object without objectifying itself and the world, i.e., how it can know, and know itself as knower, without thereby collapsing the knower into the known. Schelling's solution turns on identifying the unconscious as the force of nature within (and he thereby became in effect the 'founding father' of the 'unconscious'). Schelling finds in both 'intellectual intuition' and in the work of art the enabling paths of a non-objectifying disclosure. Intellectual intuition brings together 'what exists separately in the act of freedom and the intuition of nature: namely, the identity of the conscious and the unconscious in the intellect, together with the consciousness of this identity' (46). This identity, of finite and infinite, of what can be grasped in an objectivating instant and that which also outstrips what can be grasped and yet presents the unity of these two, is then what can (and should) become manifest in the work of art. 'Art' for Schelling thus becomes 'the only true and eternal organon which continuously and ever anew portrays what philosophy cannot depict: the unconscious in action and its identity with the conscious' (47).

Chapter 3 is entitled "Nature and Sentiment: Romanticism". Poetry meets history here in a synoptic account that extends from the Schlegels to Thoreau and from a close affinity with the world-encompassing intentions of German Idealism to the worldly retreat and subjective individualism of American transcendentalism. For Schlegel the quest for the absolute requires an orientation of perennial yearning, and a practice that takes on board the realization that conquering the absolute, nailing it once and for all, is neither our telos nor even our end-game. Oriented by an inevitable mood of perpetual yearning for an absolute that can never be exhausted, poetry becomes the teacher and philosophy the student. For Novalis, however, Nature bespeaks a progression, albeit in a dimension hidden from the mechanical or chemical view. Nature is not just what presently appears but is itself a 'church of infinite natures'. Nature is progression but not just any progression; 'it can only be explained as progressing -- toward morality', and we become its teachers (59).

For English Romantics such as Wordsworth and Coleridge the move towards nature meant a poetic turn toward the simple, rustic man whose organic relationship to his natural surroundings hadn't been sullied by the pretensions of social vanity. Coleridge however meandered away from the common man's experience toward that of the more cultivated and extraordinary. Elevated to more rarefied heights, this strain of Anglicized Romanticism wafted over the Atlantic to Harvard and into the hands of Emerson and his so-called 'Transcendental Club'. What appears to have ensued, and surely New England Protestantism had its influence, was a turn toward immediacy in the locating of moral truth -- an immediacy that increasingly took the form of individually-isolated encounters with nature, and found its quintessential expression in Thoreau's apotheosis of solitude.

What Dallmayr finds in the inward, quiescent direction of American romanticism is a clearly motivated point of departure for John Dewey's turn toward a once again outwardly-oriented, pragmatic naturalism in Chapter 4 (entitled "Nature and Experience: Dewey"). Motivated by both a reaction to the inadequacy of American transcendentalism for addressing the social and political challenges of industrial capitalism and by a continued desire to overcome mind/body dichotomies, Dewey transformatively seized upon the residues of a supple late 19th century Hegelianism to introduce the new pragmatism. Eschewing both disembodied intellectualism and any empiricism not pre-structured by human need, Dewey's pragmatism, with romantic echoes, favored future emergence over antecedent certainty. Pace the spirit of much contemporary neo-Darwinism, Dallmayr's Dewey delights in Darwin's embrace of nature's open contingency as opposed to the intentions of cocksure objectifying explanatory closure. Dewey's pursuit of a post-dualist pragmatic naturalism issued in a novel sense of experience that is neither wholly objective nor subjective in the traditional ways, which neither stands back from nature, nor hovers over it, nor is passively shaped by it but rather is affectively engaged. Experience in this sense is both constituting and constituted and is always on its way someplace and with purpose.

In Chapter 5, "Nature and Life-World: Merleau-Ponty", we find, with the mid-twentieth century ebbing of pragmatism in the United States, the continuing thread of a practically engaged, non-dualistic philosophy returning to the continent now in the form of existential phenomenology. In his early work The Structure of Behavior (where 'behavior' would be better translated as 'comportment') Merleau-Ponty is shown to be drawing upon Gestalt Theory in order to argue, post-dualistically, that we encounter the world neither as empirical sense data as yet devoid of meaning nor by way of a meaning-constituting intellect that can be rendered transparent to itself, but rather by way of a non-conceptual, and thus non self-transparent, structured form of activity by means of which we are always already engaged in and with the world. The concept of a 'life-world', which forms a coherent but pre-conceptual background in which we are practically, one might even say metabolically, embedded and which forms the necessary background only on the basis of which anything can become conceptually intelligible, can then be understood as the further outgrowth of this insight.

Apart from an apposite reference to the body as providing 'the intentional threads linking it to its surroundings', Dallmayr's review of Merleau-Ponty's now classic account of the body is very thin. Rather than revisiting this better known terrain, Dallmayr jumps up to Merleau-Ponty's posthumously published late lecture courses on 'The Concept of Nature'. This begins (first course) with Merleau-Ponty's own critical, historical overview culminating in Whitehead's (now très de rigueur) 'event' that catapults us from out of objectivating time and into nature's cosmic time. Finally, however, in his third course lecture, Merleau-Ponty returns to the body, as that 'flesh of the world' that is both continuous with the world and yet comprises the visible of its invisible. This visibility may then emigrate 'not outside of every body, but into another less heavy, more transparent body' such as the flesh of language.

Not surprisingly, given Dallmayr's proclivities, Chapter 6, "Nature and Being: Heidegger", is for all intents and purposes, the culminating chapter of the mainstream of the text. It is no secret that the ontology of Being and Time provided little help in disclosing an adequate grasp of nature (as neither the being of equipment, nor that of objects present-at-hand, nor the being of Dasein is apropos) and Dallmayr's treatment attests to this. But in a lecture course the decade following Being and Time, Heidegger had his own formative encounter with Schelling. In Schelling, whom Heidegger declared to be the high-point of German Idealism, a transformation in the understanding of the meaning of freedom started by Kant became complete. "'Kant's philosophy accomplishes the transition from the inappropriate (voluntaristic) to the appropriate concept of freedom' -- where the latter means 'independence as standing within one's own essential being'" (126). Which is to say that human existence becomes understood as an emergent expression of freedom (immanent in the on-going becoming of nature) and not vice versa.

What becomes the 'striving between earth and world' in Heidegger's subsequent work appears to have its roots in Schelling's "distinction between 'ground' and 'existence', where 'ground' means the dark, sheltered enclosure of beings (in their 'nature'), whereas 'existence' (as eksistence) means the elevation and revelation of beings into the open disclosure of truth" (128). The immanence of freedom, and that which becomes the particular possibility of the human, is dynamically located in this process. Heidegger, however, found his normative foothold with respect to nature in then returning to Aristotle's understanding of physis as that whose essence is one of self-presencing (as opposed to being brought forth externally through techné). Heidegger, dropping further back to what he takes to be the even more primordial insights of the pre-Socratics, and finding his cue in a quote from Parmenides, re-conceived of 'the essence of thinking' as a form of 'surrendering' to the Being of that which self-presences. If 'truth' is not first of all about warranted claims of accurate representational correspondence but rather about that surrendering receptivity that allows nature to show itself, i.e., truth as aletheia, then (once again) it must be poetry, not traditional philosophy that should guide us - "poetry properly situates humans on this earth (and under heaven) and thus makes possible a genuine dwelling." (139).

Dallmayr has provided us with an optic for a viewpoint of Western metaphysics that could certainly contribute to the renewal of a nature-friendly philosophical point of departure. There is an important sense however in which the very diremptions of which Dallmayr (and many) have bemoaned, and are trying to overcome, have reproduced themselves in Dallmayr's book. Few, if any, of the philosopher's that Dallmayr discussed lacked any relationship to the sciences of their time. Even near contemporaries such as Merleau-Ponty and Heidegger drew from such wells. Merleau-Ponty was extremely well-versed in gestalt psychology and Heidegger drew on von Uexküll but had also read contemporary German biologists such as Driesch, Buytendijk and Boveri.1 Is it the case that our disciplinary divides have become even more pronounced since the mid-twentieth century? It is noteworthy in this regard that Dallmayr's account omitted a discussion of Goethe, the one contemporary of Schelling, Schlegel, and Novalis whose work as a 'romantic scientist' has actually had some on-going expression in contemporary bio-scientific debates.2 One can surely question what it even means to discuss a metaphysics of nature without some engagement with contemporary science. Did not, for example, the failure of the Human Genome Project to realize its own expectations in being able to account for 'human nature' on the basis of a putative linear script provide a provocation for revisiting the legacy of Schelling, Dewey, Heidegger, etc., in contemporary terms?3 And might it not be time to bring this legacy into a new conversation with the latest developments in frontier areas such as the physics of soft condensed matter and non-equilibrium thermodynamics4, or the self-organizing capacities that underlay biological developmental phenotypic plasticity5? Dallmayer has certainly done some of the heavy-lifting in fighting this good fight.  But it is worrisome that he doesn't appear to even register the absence of a critical engagement with contemporary sciences as at least a possible basis of giving a post-dualist metaphysics some real traction,. Again, his concluding 'personal reflections' on the philosophical anthropology of Plessner and Gehlen and others may suggest an awareness late-in-the-day of an enabling path not taken.6

1 Heidegger, Martin. 1995. The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, translated by William McNeill and Nicholas Walker, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.

2 See for example Holdredge, C. & Talbott, S. (2008) Beyond Biotechnology: The Barren Promise of Genetic Engineering. Lexington: The University of Kentucky Press. See also my review: "Context, context, context! A delicate empiricism for biotechnology" (2008) Nature Biotechnology 26:59-60.

3 For a critical discussion of the implications of the Human Genome findings see Moss, L (2006) "Redundancy, Plasticity, and Detachment: The Implications of Comparative Genomics for Evolutionary Thinking". Philosophy of Science 73: 930-946.

4 See the recent laudable attempt to philosophically penetrate these areas by a non-technical specialist in Barham, J. (2012) Normativity, Agency, and Life: Teleological Realism in Biology, Lambert Academic Publishing.

5 In The Plausibility of Life: Resolving Darwin's Dilemma (2005) New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, Marc Kirschner and John Gerhart, two of our leading contemporary molecular, cell and developmental biologists have offered a completely readable and cutting-edge account of biological understanding that significantly recasts the agency of the living organism in biological evolution.  But this work has not only been completely ignored by contemporary metaphysics; it has been largely ignored even by most philosophers of biology.

6 For a general attempt at renewing and expanding the legacy of philosophical anthropology into a philosophy of nature in dialogue with contemporary sciences see Moss, L. (2009) "Detachment, Genomics and the Nature of Being Human" in New Visions of Nature: Complexity and Authenticity, Drenthen, Keulartz, Proctor (eds.) Springer International Library of Environmental, Agricultural and Food Ethics. For an attempt at addressing issues in normative social theory from a post-dualistic philosophy of nature and philosophical anthropology see Moss, L, Pavesich, V. (2011) "Science, Normativity and Skill: Reviewing and Renewing the Anthropological Basis of Critical Theory". Philosophy and Social Criticism 37:139-165.