Returning to Revolution: Deleuze, Guattari and Zapatismo

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Thomas Nail, Returning to Revolution: Deleuze, Guattari and Zapatismo, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 216pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748655861.

Reviewed by Nathan Jun, Midwestern State University


A little more than twenty years ago the last vestiges of Soviet communism were crumbling and Western intellectuals were triumphantly announcing the end of history. Looking back at that era, it seems amazing that the spirit of revolution ever returned at all, let alone as quickly as it did. Within a decade of the fall of the Berlin Wall the alter-globalization movement was gaining momentum around the world, following close on the heels of the Zapatista uprising in 1994. Revolutionary activity continued in fits and starts throughout the first decade of the twenty-first century and set the stage for the Arab Spring in 2010 and Occupy Wall Street in 2011. Throughout this period many academic philosophers, with a few notable exceptions, remained distracted by decades-old debates, seemingly oblivious to the changes taking place around them. It is, therefore, extremely refreshing to read Thomas Nail's Returning to Revolution, a work of academic philosophy which boldly takes up "the return of a new theory and practice of revolution" -- the theory and practice inherent in fifteen years' worth of revolutionary movements and events frequently overlooked in mainstream philosophical circles.

As Nail correctly notes in his introduction, traditional liberal and Marxist strategies such as "the capture of the state, the political representation of the party, the centrality of the proletariat, or the leadership of the vanguard" (1) have not only failed repeatedly over the course of the last century but have been largely surpassed by other strategies. Despite this fact, few philosophers have paid these developments the attention they deserve. On the contrary, many Anglophone philosophers continue to operate within a fundamentally liberal framework while practitioners of "Continental philosophy" remain uncritically indebted to the old hermeneuts of suspicion. In an effort to remedy this situation, Nail aims "to map an outline" of recent political developments "by drawing on the theory and practice of two of [their] main inspirations: French political philosophers Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari and . . . the Zapatistas of Chiapas, Mexico" (1). (Here a fair warning is in order: Nail draws extensively upon technical aspects of Deleuze and Guattari's philosophy that could very well prove incomprehensible to novice readers. The book is not recommended for those with anything less than advanced familiarity with and understanding of Deleuze and Guattari. For purposes of the present review, I will try my best to avoid technical jargon and focus instead on the book's general aims, purposes, and methodology.)

Nail's outline of the revolutionary return is guided by four questions:

what is the relationship between history and revolution? What is revolutionary transformation? How is it possible to sustain and carry out and sustain the consequences of a revolutionary transformation? And how do revolutions connect with one another to produce a new form of worldwide solidarity? (2)

In response, Nail attempts to provide a "philosophical clarification" of four contemporary revolutionary strategies -- namely, "(1) a multi-centered diagnostic of political power; (2) a prefigurative strategy of political transformation; (3) a participatory strategy of creating a body politic; and (4) a political strategy of belonging based on mutual global solidarity." The four chapters of the book examine each of these strategies in turn by placing them in dialogue with the thought of Deleuze and Guattari and the practice of the Zapatistas. Although Nail is certainly not the first to draw upon Deleuze and Guattari in an effort to understand contemporary politics, his approach in so doing -- which he calls "constructivism" -- is importantly distinct.

Indeed, one of the book's most important achievements is demonstrating how "constructivism" functions as an alternative to other approaches in Deleuzian political philosophy such as those of Paul Patton and Antoni Negri/Michael Hardt. Where these philosophers have understood Deleuze and Guattari's thought in terms of the static categories of liberal representationalism (Patton) or else the indeterminacy of pure becoming (Hardt and Negri), Nail's constructivist approach shows how Deleuze and Guattari can provide concrete strategies for revolutionary intervention. Like Marx, he is not content to describe the revolutionary turn; rather, he wants to show how the revolutionary return can be sustained over time and made to bear fruit.

In his first chapter, Nail discusses what he calls "the multi-centered diagnostic of political power." Conventional political philosophies such as liberalism and Marxism trace the origins of power to a unitary locus, which in turn generates a unitary conception of political means and ends. In orthodox Marxism-Leninism, for example, the economic base is the ultimate engine of political, social, and economic power (and, by extension, exploitation), which in turn presents the revolutionary transformation of the economic base as an ultimate political end. Within this framework, strategies for intervention are judged in terms of their conduciveness to achieving this end ("the end justifies the means"). Drawing upon Deleuze and Guattari's theory of historical topology and the Zapatista's practice of "diagnostic suffering" (38), Nail contends that political power emanates from multiple sites, none of which constitutes a "foundation" for the others. What is more, multi-centered emanations of power can and often do intersect with one another in novel and unpredictable ways, giving rise to new forms of power in the process (64-5).

For this reason, it is inadvisable, if not altogether impossible, to pursue "one-size-fits-all" strategies for political intervention (75). Political ends cannot be unambiguously articulated "within the absolute limits and borders of political representation" (96) -- that is, as singular and unchanging concepts which provide a stable frame of reference for devising political means. Instead, as Nail discusses at length in chapter 2, political strategies work by disclosing what is possible in response to shifting configurations of power on the ground. Means prefigure ends, operating through what Deleuze and Guattari call "absolute positive deterritorialization":

a kind of transformation that not only escapes the absolute limits and borders of political representation, but also connects up to an increasing number of other absolutely positive deterritorialized elements whose ultimate collective aim is the immanent transformation of the present intersection of political processes through the prefigurative transformation of a new world (96).

For Deleuze and Guattari, "deterritorialization" may be understood as the emergence of possibilities which create (or are capable of creating) change. "Absolute positive deterritorialization" refers to the emergence of macro-level possibilities (i.e., ends) which are generated by the intersection of various micro-level possibilities (i.e., means). The localized, experimental practice of creating alternatives discloses what is globally possible -- it demonstrates the kinds of new worlds which can emerge "from within the shell of the old." Drawing again on several examples from the Zapatistas, Nail demonstrates what prefigurative practice looks like on the ground (100-6).

In chapters 3 and 4, Nail discusses two additional strategies -- viz., participatory politics and the creation of mutual global solidarity -- which are intimately linked to the multi-centered diagnostic of power and prefigurative politics. Appealing to Deleuze and Guattri's concept of "consistency" as well as to the Zapatista practice of "leading by obeying" (mandar obedeciendo), Nail conceptualizes the political community (i.e., "the body politic") not in terms of static categories of identity (e.g., citizens, the working class, etc.) but as "a participatory set of conditions, elements and agencies engaged in a maximal degree of mutual and direct transformation" (146). The body politic emerges immanently within local and participatory struggles; "it is . . . an unambivalent commitment to more than just change as such: it is the creation of specific new elements and agencies" in response to shifting iterations of power. Participation is the process through which these iterations are identified and, accordingly, new possibilities for political transformation are formulated and pursued. Chapter 4 considers how local participatory bodies can "connect to one another and assemble a larger global alternative to neoliberalism" (152) through the cultivation of mutual solidarity.

Although Nail's analysis of contemporary revolutionary movements is extremely well-argued and thought-provoking, his overall approach is not entirely novel -- a fact which he fails to acknowledge. As early as 1989 (and again in 1994), Todd May argued that Deleuze and Guattari, along with Foucault and Lyotard, provide the best theoretical framework (which May terms "poststructuralist anarchism") within which to analyze and understand contemporary revolutionary movements. Although May doesn't discuss the Zapatistas -- the Zapatista uprising having taken place the same year as the publication of The Political Philosophy of Poststructuralist Anarchism -- a subsequent book (Gilles Deleuze, 2005) uses the example of the Palestinian liberation movement to make a case similar to Nail's. The fact that May is not discussed in Returning to Revolution is, in my view, a shortcoming.

Furthermore, I think Nail overstates his case somewhat in claiming that the "revolutionary return" is an altogether "new" phenomenon. In point of fact, each of the four revolutionary strategies he discusses (multi-centered diagnosis of political power; prefiguration; participatory political organization; and mutual global solidarity) can be found in varying degrees in the writings of various nineteenth and early twentieth century anarchists, to say nothing of actual historical interventions such as the Spanish Civil War. As I argue at length in Anarchism and Political Modernity (2011), the theoretical and practical trajectories which Nail (and, for that matter, May) observe in recent French philosophy and contemporary revolutionary practice were already on display more than a century ago in the historical anarchist movement. It is somewhat surprising to me that Nail, a scholar of anarchism himself, appears to ignore anarchism in his book. I would like to know how, why, and to what extent Nail believes the contemporary "revolutionary return" differs from earlier (and similar) revolutionary movements such as anarchism.

Notwithstanding these modest misgivings, I believe that Return to Revolution is extremely well-done, and I highly recommend it to anyone who is interested in the theoretical and practical underpinnings of contemporary revolutionary movements. The book is compellingly argued and extremely well-researched, and Nail does an excellent job of explaining difficult concepts with clarity, rigor, and precision.


Jun, Nathan. Anarchism and Political Modernity. New York: Continuum, 2011.

May, Todd. Gilles Deleuze. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.

_________. "Is Poststructuralist Political Theory Anarchist?" Philosophy and Social

Criticism 15:2 (1989): 275-84.

_________. The Political Philosophy of Poststructuralist Anarchism. University Park,

Pa: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1994.