Revealing Art

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Matthew Kieran, Revealing Art, Routledge, 2005, 296pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415278546.

Reviewed by Jonathan Neufeld, Vanderbilt University


Revealing Art is a lively exploration of questions concerning value in art. Matthew Kieran presents a series of engaging arguments illuminated by examples drawn from across the history of European visual art, from the Roettgen Pietà to Poussin's The Adoration of the Golden Calf to Gillian Wearing's Signs series. As Kieran touches on a variety of problems in analytic philosophy of art, his pluralistic account of artistic value emerges. Each chapter focuses on a particular value or closely related set of values but, rather than immediately diving into abstract arguments drawn from recent literature in philosophy, Kieran draws on readers' intuitions about concrete examples in an almost conversational manner to make his philosophical points. As a result, the book will have something to offer to specialists and non-specialists alike. Chapter One argues that aesthetic experience is not the sole, or perhaps even primary, source of artistic value. Through a discussion of forgeries and perfect copies, Kieran argues for the importance of the Romantic values of originality and imaginative expression. Chapter Two focuses on what remains of beauty after the devaluation of aesthetic experience. Chapter Three investigates whether and how art contributes insights to our understanding of the world. A defense of the possibility of pornographic art begins Kieran's discussion of the relevance of a work's moral character to its artistic value in Chapter Four. Finally, Chapter Five proposes a broadly humanistic account of the evaluation of works that draws on all of the values discussed in the previous chapters.

The book's arguments simultaneously give the appearance of moderation and boldness. In the case of each major value considered, a similarly formed moderate conclusion is reached: "Taken as a view of what all art must be, or the doctrine that art should only be valued in such terms, it loses sight of much that we appreciate art for" (46). In this particular passage, Kieran is referring to imaginative expression, but the "it" could be replaced by any doctrine Kieran addresses. In each chapter, a possible value is taken up and Kieran argues against those who would either deny or overstate the role the value might play in artistic practice. For example, in the chapter on the cognitive value of art, Kieran considers the possibility that truth might play an enriching role in artistic appreciation:

Assessing works in terms of their insight, profundity, complexity, interest, coherence, consistency, depth or intelligibility … involves a cluster of notions that are mutually interdependent amongst which is the notion of truth. Works can indeed be profound and yet mistaken or true to life yet banal; insights can be partial. But this doesn't show truth is always irrelevant. All it shows is that there are many intellectual and affective virtues proper to art, only one of which is truth (126).

In the concluding sentences of the chapter on the role of beauty in artistic appreciation, in which Kieran argues against Kant's account of aesthetic judgment, he writes, "We should value beauty and the regarding of aesthetic interest. But that cannot be the whole story of the value of art" (98). In each case, Kieran puts forward a logically moderate position eschewing absolutes and universal claims -- truth and insight, beauty and aesthetic appreciation, and moral character each can play a role in the evaluation of art.

The constant and insistent return to moderate positions (moderate cognitivism, a fascinating form of moderate moralism, moderate expressivism) reveals a core pluralism that may initially appear as a sort of retreat to a sensible, comfortable middle ground. But a closer look at how Kieran arrives at his conclusions shows his pluralism to be more audacious and the middle ground to be less comfortable than a bald statement of his moderate conclusions lets on. His logically moderate positions usually emerge from bold, challenging, and, one might say, uncomfortable counterexamples to alternative theories. For example, Kieran argues that beauty cannot be a universal value of art in part because ugliness, the grotesque and the disgusting can all be positive artistic values. Kieran is careful to point out that he is not making a weaker claim that, under some conditions, what would otherwise be thought ugly can be beautiful. Through a discussion of some of Jenny Saville's work, Kieran advances the argument that that the ugly, disgusting, and grotesque can in themselves positively contribute to a work's value. However, to go too far and to fall into a perverse nihilism in which the ugly and the grotesque are always values is to make a mistake. Wherein lies the difference between a degenerate, nihilistic perversity and an artistically legitimate instance of the grotesque? Kieran resolutely refuses to resolve the difficulty for the reader and seems to embrace the danger of nihilism raised by positively valuing the ugly while simultaneously warning against succumbing to nihilism. So, while even the bold claims are logically moderate, they do not serve to circumscribe a comfortable middle ground. Rather, they serve to highlight the demands of pluralism and the challenges of participating in the "conversation of art" (219).

In fact, Kieran is boldest, advocating what amount to the least comfortable positions, when he is at his most moderate. In the chapter on the relevance of moral value to art, he claims that the moral character of a work can be artistically relevant in four ways: (1) Morally good messages can contribute to the artistic value of a work. (2) Morally bad messages can detract from the artistic value of a work. (3) Morally good messages can detract from the artistic value of a work. Finally, (4) morally bad character can enrich the artistic value of a work. A more moderate position, given these variables, is not possible. (3) and (4) involve the most striking arguments and, combined with his defense of pornographic art, reveal the underlying normative demands of Kieran's pluralism.

That in some cases morally good messages can detract from a work's artistic value is not terribly surprising -- the artistic pitfalls of didacticism have been pointed out for centuries. Kieran's argument, using Norman Rockwell's Four Freedoms series completed in the middle of World War II as an example, is nevertheless quite illuminating. While "the sentiments and attitudes manifested are deeply admirable and the paintings are far from artistically poor," the paintings are worse because the "morally good sentiments are cheaply won" (184). The easily received representational style and the smooth contribution of all formal elements of the painting to the manifest moral content combine to detract from the value of the work. No belief, moral or otherwise, is enriched or illuminated -- everything the audience already believed and felt is merely and comfortably confirmed. While Kieran is careful to claim that an audience need not be challenged to change their beliefs by all good art, all good art must draw us into a reflective engagement with our beliefs, even if they are confirmed in the end. Compelling as this example might be, the argument does not quite hit its mark of showing that moral goodness itself can be an artistic fault. Instead, Kieran establishes that the easy presentation of moral goodness -- as though moral beliefs and sentiments come without struggle -- is an artistic defect. Rather than imaginatively engaging his audience, Rockwell merely panders to them. Nevertheless, what Kieran has shown is provocative and interesting and, as we shall see, it is in perfect keeping with the rest of the book.

The demands of pluralism are even more apparent in Kieran's argument that morally bad character can actually contribute positively to a work's artistic value. Kieran's is not simply the much weaker claim that we can bracket morally bad character so that it has no negative effect, which is a common enough view. Kieran means to argue that morally bad content itself might contribute to the artistically good character of a work. The book's central examples of valuably immoral works of art are those of Francis Bacon. Reproduced in all of their rich, disturbing color are Bacon's Three Studies for Figures at the Base of a Crucifixion (c. 1944). Kieran argues that these pieces, along with Study for the Head of a Screaming Pope and Study after Velasquez's Portrait of Pope Innocent X (1953), reveal "a view of the human condition that is … intensely bleak, bereft and base … Bacon's work shows a world of embodied pain we are to observe, feel and accept" (189). Kieran objects to Bacon's generalization that humans are nothing but diseased, deformed flesh. Though there is something importantly true that Bacon shows us about human nature (we can be base, deformed, etc.), the generalization, the dark mood which he "smears over the entire world," (193) is false. "We can be good, altruistic and driven by noble feelings, and appreciate refined sentiments" (193). Rather than stopping here and arguing that Bacon makes an artistically relevant cognitive mistake about the way the world is, Kieran argues that Bacon's view of the world is immoral. Bacon's pictures do invite us to judge human nature falsely, but the false judgment is nevertheless intelligible and is not an artistically relevant cognitive defect. Moreover, Bacon's work teaches us something valuable about ourselves. Not only is the base, animal side of humanity just under the surface, so too is the temptation to condemn and give up on humanity because of its animal side. To condemn humanity in this manner is a moral mistake. Understanding this condemnation, even being immorally encouraged to consider it, is precisely what gives Bacon's work its unique artistic power and value. While the entanglement of cognitive and moral values might detract from the clarity of Kieran's particular defense of the artistic value of immoral works, it is a convincing exemplification of the sort of imaginative engagement demanded by pluralism.

Kieran's view of pornography takes us to the normative core of Revealing Art's pluralism. After assessing and dismissing several arguments that pornography can never have artistic value, Kieran concludes that some pornography may have artistic value. "The difference between pornographic art works and ordinary pornography is that the former deploy artistry in imaginative and interesting ways and thus can be appreciated as pornographic art. Indeed this enables some such works to reveal something to us about the nature of sensuality, desires and the human condition" (165). His diagnosis of those who would claim that no art, as such, can be pornographic is telling and captures the central and unifying demand of pluralism: "The denial that such works are pornographic is driven by the idea that all good art civilizes. Pornographic art threatens this assumption because it speaks directly to sexual instincts, desires and drives which often threaten to overwhelm our higher natures. That is why they are troubling. Attempting to domesticate them by pretending they do not is to avert one's gaze both from their artistry and from our own nature" (161). This worry about the domestication of art is at the heart of Kieran's book. The imposition of any overreaching conception of value domesticates art -- it makes art comfortable. To domesticate art is to deny its ability to challenge and engage the viewer in any number of possible ways. Pluralism demands cognitive openness from the viewer -- she should not impose her prejudices about how the world is when approaching a work of art. Pluralism demands moral openness from the viewer -- although a great work may be immoral, the viewer needs imaginatively to engage it to be enriched and, perhaps, to appreciate why she holds the moral beliefs that she does.

What initially appear to be nothing more than particularly rich counterexamples to overreaching monistic theories of artistic value have actually turned out to be exemplars of artistic achievement. The insights and enrichment offered by good art -- expressive, cognitive, moral -- are not and ought not be cheaply won. Imaginative engagement with great art, being a responsible participant in the conversation of art, involves a reflective consideration of both a variety of types of value, and engagement with a variety of values. To enter into the conversation of art, one needs to be open to new imaginative experiences that entail a wide range of openness involving reflection on one's own deeply held assumptions concerning expressive, imaginative, cognitive, or moral value. Holding too closely to comfortable beliefs and sentiments, even when they themselves are appropriate, can get in the way of the development of artistic appreciation. To avert our eyes from revealing art is to deny that there is always something more that we could appreciate, that our inner lives could use more cultivation (255). To avert our eyes is to show a lack of humility insofar as it involves a tacit claim that our current state is better than this one we might imaginatively encounter. To avert our eyes is to retreat to the comfortably familiar. For Kieran, it would seem that familiarity breeds contempt and comfort threatens to transform even our true beliefs and good moral sentiments into what Mill would call dead dogma.

It is not clear that Kieran fully appreciates the demands of pluralism and the bold moderation that accompanies it. While arguing against those who would "suggest that art works may be valuable only where they challenge our pre-existing beliefs, attitudes and values" (108), Kieran argues that not all good works challenge our existing beliefs -- some merely "illuminate and enrich our assumptions" (109). Like many liberal political theorists, Kieran misses the normative force of his own demand for openness. Challenges to assumptions and beliefs do not simply lie in the conclusion of some deliberation about them. It is a challenge to our deepest assumptions and beliefs to open them to reflective deliberation in the first place. The idea that settled beliefs and sentiments -- moral and cognitive assumptions and "prejudices" about morality, human nature, our inner lives, our bodies -- ought in principle and in practice always be open to reflective consideration and change is a challenge to settled beliefs. It is a challenge to a deeply held belief as deeply held. It is a profound challenge to, say, a religious belief about the essentially corrupt nature of bodies and humanity to open it to the imaginative reflection that constitutes Kieran's conversation of art. The plurality of the sources of value in art carries with it a demand for both cognitive and normative openness, and those unwilling to open their "prejudices" to illumination and change will necessarily miss the true value of great works of art. Kieran is to be commended for relentlessly revealing the demands of moderation even if, in the end, his portrayal of liberal humanism is a bit too comfortable.