Revenge of the Liar: New Essays on the Paradox

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JC Beall (ed.), Revenge of the Liar: New Essays on the Paradox, Oxford University Press, 2008, 374pp., $49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199233908.

Reviewed by Leon Horsten, University of Bristol/University of Leuven


The liar paradox has been with us for a very long time. Mainly through the work of Tarski and Kripke, we have in the past century made considerable progress in the area of the semantic paradoxes. Even though we have certainly not arrived at a completely satisfactory solution to the liar paradox and its relatives, it is fair to say that as a result of our attempts to tame the liar, deeper insight has been acquired into the concept of truth. (This is witnessed by the discussion of deflationism about truth in recent decades.) But many of the proposed solutions to the liar paradox are marred by a new and vexing problem of their own making: the so-called strengthened liar paradox.

Some of the most prominent solutions that have been proposed for the liar paradox in the closing decades of the twentieth century are the following: Kripke's truth value gap solution, Priest's dialetheist solution, Burge's contextualist solution, and Gupta and Belnap's revision theory of truth. Except for the revision theory of truth, (variants on) all these solutions receive attention in this collection.

According to Kripke's theory, the liar sentence has no truth value. In Priest's view, the liar sentence is both true and false. According to Burge's theory, the truth value of the liar sentence shifts from one conversational context to another. (In his article on Bradwardine's theory of truth, which is the only historical article in the collection, Stephen Read shows how present-day contextualism had to some extent been foreshadowed in the middle ages.)

The most conspicuous development in the theory of the semantic paradoxes in recent years consists in articulating increasingly sophisticated variations on theories that were developed in the 1970s and 1980s. For example, Keith Simmons' theory of truth is clearly of the same family as the contextualist theory of truth that was advocated in Burge (1979). But Simmons' theory contains more details about the nature of the contexts that co-determine the extension of the concept of truth. And Tim Maudlin's theory is based on Kripke's (1975) theory of truth. But he has added to Kripke's theory a distinctive pragmatic theory of assertion. According to this theory it is permissible to assert certain sentences that are not true (such as the sentence that says that the liar sentence is not true).

There is a question whether, by their own lights, recent proposed solutions to the liar paradox can be regarded as satisfactory. Consider for instance Kripke's theory of truth. According to Kripke's theory the liar sentence has no truth value, i.e., the liar sentence is neither true nor false. So, in particular, the liar sentence is not true. But that is precisely what it says of itself. So the liar sentence is true after all! This argument is the strengthened liar paradox for Kripke's truth theory. Similarly strengthened liar arguments, or revenge arguments as they are sometimes called, have been mounted against contextualist solutions and against dialetheist solutions of the liar paradox.

That such revenge arguments can be formulated has been known at least since Kripke (1975). Indeed, in his article Kripke explicitly discusses the merits of the strengthened liar argument against his own theory. Since then, more than three decades have passed. It is time to ask where matters stand -- and that is precisely the aim of the book under review. In this collection of articles, fifteen prominent researchers in the field of the semantic paradoxes evaluate the impact of strengthened liar arguments on the most prominent contemporary truth theories.

Some contributors to the volume describe new aspects of strengthened liar reasoning without offering a cure. Greg Restall argues in his article that the Curry paradox needs fewer resources than one might think, whereby more of classical logic needs to be given up than anticipated. Stewart Shapiro shows how revenge reasoning also applies to the Burali-Forti paradox. He lays out several options for responding to strengthened Burali-Forti reasoning, without decidedly endorsing any of them.

From the contributions it is clear that there is no agreement whatsoever about the status quaestionis. There is no consensus about which theories are subject to revenge attacks from the liar. And there is also no consensus about how we should respond to revenge arguments.

Let me first illustrate the lack of consensus about which theories are vulnerable to strengthened liar arguments. The theory that receives most attention in this collection is Harty Field's theory of truth, which he has articulated in great detail in Field (2008). Like Maudlin's theory, Field's theory is based on a Kripkean truth value gap approach to the liar paradox. But Field adds to the language of Kripke's theory a conditional operator which satisfies most (but not all) logical principles that one would expect a conditional operator to satisfy. Moreover, the unrestricted Tarski-biconditionals hold for this operator. It is then natural to wonder whether a strengthened liar argument affects Field's theory of truth. After all, there is some sense in which Field wants to assert that the liar sentence is not determinately true. Field argues in his contribution to this volume that his theory is ultimately invulnerable to strengthened liar arguments. He argues that the notion of determinate truth which is needed in the formulation of revenge arguments against his theory is in the end unintelligible. Hannes Leitgeb has doubts about this. He argues that it depends on the details of the metatheory of Field's theory of truth. According to Agustin Rayo and P.D. Welch, revenge problems are definitely in the offing for Field if higher-order logic is accepted. And Priest is convinced that Field's theory is in a simple and straightforward way vulnerable to revenge of the strengthened liar. At the same time, he believes that it is rather clear that his own dialetheist theory is immune against revenge arguments. In Simmons' view, however, it is not hard to see when one tries to evaluate the sentence 'This sentence is false only' that Priest's theory is also subject to a strengthened liar argument. Matti Eklund, too, thinks that Priest's theory is subject to a substantial challenge from the strengthened liar.

Some authors believe that our everyday notion of truth is inconsistent because it is governed by the unrestricted Tarski-biconditionals. Graham Priest, Douglas Patterson, and Kevin Scharp argue for the inconsistency of our concept of truth, but they do so in very different ways. If they are right, then there is still the question whether we should strive to articulate a consistent substitute notion of truth for our (inconsistent) everyday notion of truth which is in some sense 'close' to our everyday concept of truth. Priest thinks that there are reasons independent from the liar paradox for believing that there are true contradictions. The project of articulating consistent truth-like concepts therefore carries little appeal to him. Scharp, however, is genuinely interested in finding consistent substitutes for our inconsistent concept of truth. He argues that our inconsistent truth concept is a mixture of two consistent truth concepts. The consistent concept Truth1 is governed by the truth introduction rule ('from φ, infer that φ is true'), while the consistent concept Truth2 is governed by the truth elimination rule ('from the truth of φ, infer φ'). In my view, these two truth concepts are simply too weak as they stand. Recent work in proof theoretic approaches to the semantic paradoxes shows that one can add more intuitive truth principles to the principle governing Truth1 and to the principle governing Truth1 without lapsing into inconsistency. Friedman and Sheard (1987) gives a good overview of the possibilities here. Patterson, too, believes that our ordinary understanding of truth is governed by the unrestricted Tarski-biconditionals, which on pain of contradiction cannot all be true. Strangely, he does not give an indication of which of the Tarski-biconditionals he does take to be true. Thus it is no surprise that, in the absence of a theory of the liar paradox, his view is immune to revenge arguments.

In response to strengthened liar arguments, some contributors argue that certain notions which seem intelligible, ultimately aren't. This line is taken, as we have seen, by Field who holds that there is no notion of determinate truth that satisfies all the properties that one would intuitively be inclined to require it to have.

Maudlin's reaction (if I understand him correctly) to attempts to take strengthened liar revenge on his truth theory is different. He recognizes that a putative strengthened liar argument shows that any ideal set of pragmatic rules will judge either some truths to be unassertible or some falsehoods to be assertible. From this, Maudlin concludes that no such ideal set of pragmatic rules of assertion can exist.

Some authors believe that strengthened liar reasoning should be put to positive instead of destructive use. In a sense, contextualists can be seen to belong to this camp. Simmons, for instance, argues that strengthened liar reasoning generates a context in which the liar sentence can be said to be true after all. Roy T. Cook argues that strengthened liar reasoning forces us to recognize intermediate truth values that run all the way through the (open-ended) ordinal numbers. Eklund takes strengthened liar reasoning to expose expressive incompleteness of any language and at the same time to point to a way in which any given language can be coherently extended. This leads him to sketch the contours of a future theory of possible languages. In fact, the authors who belong to this camp are likely to supplement their theory with a component that is like Field's response to the strengthened liar. For instance, Cook holds that, contrary to appearances, the sentence 'This sentence is either outright false or has one of the pathological truth values' is in the end unintelligible. More precisely, this means that according to Cook there is no absolute notion of 'having one of the pathological truth values'.

Thomas Hofweber sketches a refreshingly new but somewhat underdeveloped approach to the liar paradox. In his view, even our rules of deductive logic are not without exceptions: they are default rules only. Just like penguins are exceptions to the general truth that 'Birds fly', the argument of the liar paradox involves either an exception to the (quasi-logical) Tarski biconditional scheme or to the rules of classical logic. Thus he finds the argument of the liar paradox rationally flawless. Unfortunately Hofweber does not analyze the situation in further detail here. In particular, one would like to know whether the contradiction to which the liar argument leads is due to an exception to the Tarskian truth scheme or to an exception to one or more rules of deductive reasoning that are used in the liar argument (or both).

So where does all of this leave us? Given the extensive disagreement about strengthened liar reasoning, as witnessed in this collection, it seems safe to predict that the problem of the strengthened liar will play an important role in the field of the semantic paradoxes for some time to come. To conclude, let me sketch a proposed solution that is not discussed in the collection under review and which may, admittedly, sound too simple to be tenable. Maudlin seems to me right in emphasizing that in the discussion of the liar paradox, the concept of assertion is key. Maudlin is also right to identify as a lesson of the liar paradox that we should neither assert nor deny the liar sentence. But he goes wrong when he asserts that the liar sentence is not true. Indeed, 'Only assert what you take to be true' should be taken to be an elementary constraint on any pragmatic theory of assertion. So pace Maudlin we should refuse to make any assertions about the truth-theoretic status of the liar sentence. Now one might accuse this stance of 'assertive incompleteness'. Don't we know (as a result of going through the argument of the liar paradox) that the liar sentence is not true but truth valueless? To which I reply that we know no such thing. Indeed, to belabor what by now should be a platitude, the strengthened liar argument alerts us to this. In sum, we can indeed reason ourselves into a contradiction from the supposition that the liar sentence is true. But it does not follow from this that the liar sentence is not true. When dealing with the semantic paradoxes, we should be steadfast and reason only on the basis of the inference rules of partial logic.


Burge, T. (1979) "Semantical Paradox," Journal of Philosophy 76(1979), p. 169-198.

Field, H. (2008) Saving Truth from Paradox. Oxford University Press.

Friedman, H. and Sheard, M. (1987) "An Axiomatic Approach to Self-Referential Truth," Annals of Pure and Applied Logic 33(1987), p. 1-33.

Kripke, S. (1975) "Outline of a Theory of Truth," Journal of Philosophy 72(1975), p. 690-716.