Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-Imagining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce's Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey

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Frank M. Oppenheim, S.J., Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-Imagining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce's Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 520pp, $68.00 (hbk), ISBN 0268040192.

Reviewed by Roger Ward, Georgetown College


Josiah Royce's relation to American philosophy and pragmatism is a puzzle. His powerful intellect is apparent from his many books and lectures, and William James famously recognized and encouraged Royce as a young philosopher, arranging for his position at Harvard. The puzzle is that Royce's mature philosophy led to a stark separation from James, a blatant rejection by John Dewey, and a relatively marginal role in the developing drama of American pragmatism. Frank Oppenheim claims that this marginalization is an error, and he argues that a thorough evaluation of Royce's relationships with Peirce, James, and Dewey show his creative philosophical genius. Oppenheim thinks Royce should have a place closer to center stage, hence the "re-imagining pragmatism" in the subtitle.

There is another story line in this book, however. Running behind the philosophical narrative is a positive description of a Christian pragmatism that in places almost has the feel of an apologia. Pragmatism, through the immense influence of James and Dewey, is almost exclusively understood to mean "anti-supernatural" and therefore also "anti-Christian." James nuanced this rejection more than Dewey so that pragmatism was not necessarily in opposition to "religious experience." Royce, under the influence of Hegel and later under the influence of Peirce, argues for both an Absolute and a duty that arises to a holy obligation -- loyalty to the beloved community. Royce, emboldened by Peirce's logical defense of the agapistic character of the universe and his late "Neglected Argument for the Reality of God," renders a systematic account of Christianity in semiotic categories. It is this systematization of the Absolute that intrigues but threatens James, and simply appears nonsensical (non-pragmatic) to Dewey.

The title,"Reverence for the Relations of Life," is from Royce's early book on California. Oppenheim adopts this locution as the touchstone revelation/discovery that gives continuity to the shifts in Royce's philosophical emphases. He divides Royce's career into four periods: early,1875-1892, in which a Hegelian influence is apparent in The Spirit of Modern Philosophy; second, 1896-1907, which begins his focus on argument inspired by Peirce's logic and oriented toward describing the individual; third,1908-1913, the most significant period according to Oppenheim, in which Royce explores the role of an interpreting community and an Interpreter following Peirce's argument for a teleological character of the universe that favors an Absolute knower; and fourth, 1914-1916, the period Royce focused on a response to the problem of evil. (405ff) In light of these stages it becomes clear that Royce's aim resolves into a sustained examination of the philosophical dimension of individual human lives transformed in practice through loyalty to the Logos-Spirit and the Christian community. Oppenheim highlights Royce's intellectualized pastoral concern that men and women "fail to be genuine unless they promote the greater union of the entire human family -- that is, of the Great Community." (360) Royce holds to his office as a philosopher seeking the truth at all costs, and his conclusion is that this life of the spirit, reverence for the relations of life, is "perfectly capable of logical statement." (431)

The format of this book is somewhat labyrinthine. Oppenheim begins with an overview of Royce's biography and the four periods of his thought. In serial fashion he examines Royce in relation to Peirce, James, and Dewey. He retraces Royce's biography showing the intersections with each thinker, examines the intellectual influences and disputes through the periods of Royce's philosophical development, and then develops topics in comparison with each thinker, most prominently ethics, religion, theory of knowledge, community, and "psychological attitudes and philosophical choices." This repetitive examination of Royce reinforces the texts and ideas central to Oppenheim's thinking, and provides ample opportunities to explore a vast amount of biographical information, comments from correspondence, and lesser known sources. A rich picture of the personal and philosophical interplay between these men emerges from these sources.

For instance, Oppenheim quotes a letter from Pierce stating "Royce's opinions developed in his 'World and the Individual' are extremely near to mine. His insistence on the element of purpose in intellectual concepts is essentially the pragmatistic position." (22) Peirce later qualifies this positive assessment, but he respected Royce and wanted him visit Arisbe so he could learn some Hegel and teach Royce some logic. James also responded to The World and the Individual with praise to Royce and Harvard President Elliot, but with disparaging remarks to his sons calling it "a tissue of rotten reasoning." (110) In fact James sought to overthrow Royce's argument for an Absolute, which he attends to in his Varieties. In a similar vein, Dewey responded to Royce in the Harrison lectures of 1910, referring implicitly to his ideas as "marked by aloofness, by irresponsibility, by pompous futility," comments that Oppenheim finds uncharitable for a fellow professional. (293) These temporal and personal illustrations cast a different light on the fluctuating philosophical meaning of pragmatism. Oppenheim succeeds in showing that the debate about pragmatism, reality and truth, and the competing claims about the converging or non-converging character of human knowledge, is a personal as well as a philosophical struggle. There is heart and soul in these debates, a genuine Jamesian "clash of personalities." Oppenheim's descriptions are studded with some brilliant summaries such as this one: "With Dewey one may hold that the most radical aspect of these experiencing organisms lies with their interaction with their environment. Or, with Royce, one may hold that these organisms live as embodied truth-seeking spirits." (330)

Although the somewhat repetitive treatment reinforces key texts and points concerning Royce's fundamental ideas, the overall effect of the text is a kind of wandering. It was difficult to anticipate where the argument was leading, or why a particular topic was so placed and emphasized. Frequently used quotations and idioms began to lose traction as disparate meaning contexts were piled around one or two stack poles. I found myself puzzling about the organizing idea of the argument.

With that comment aside, let me approach the subject directly -- the thought of Josiah Royce. Oppenheim expertly delves into the most interesting issues, discussing how Royce influenced Peirce in conceiving ethics as the paradigmatic normative science, of which logic is one element of bringing the act of reasoning under self-critical control. From his Hegelian fascination with Spirit, Royce recognized the need for a substantial account of the individual, but one that does not collapse into James's excessive individualism. Royce's argument that an individual separate from a community is irretrievably lost warrants renewed attention. As does Royce's claim that the direction of human intelligence is informed by the movement toward redemptive acts in relation to the Great Community, rather than Dewey's notion that the community is a natural expression of successful advances in instrumental control of material conditions. In each of these examples we see how Royce moves directly toward the most critical issues in each thinker -- Peirce's relation of self-control to the discovery of universal categories, James' rather exclusive and narrow focus on the individual's will, and the limiting character of Dewey's naturalism. While Royce stood firm in these challenging philosophical conclusions, it cost him dearly in terms of friendship and professional notice. But he was secure in his focus on practice, and his theories developed with enough fallibilism to permit him to adjust his explanations in light of critical logical examination. All these are clear hallmarks of the "pragmatisitic position" Peirce recognized. Altogether, Oppenheim makes a compelling case that Royce exposes internal fault lines in the pragmatist's self-understanding, fault lines that must not, cannot be ignored without compromising our intellectual integrity.

One of the examinations that Oppenheim's work presses forward is asking what our present forms of pragmatism lack. On one hand it is clear that no person with the creative philosophical power of Peirce, James, or Dewey has emerged into our conscience and thought. Royce fits uneasily in the category of creative genius, although his development of loyalty certainly influenced people like Walter Rauschenbush and Martin Luther King, Jr. But Royce makes a different level of philosophical critique possible. The pragmatists aimed to do something new, something novel, and in fact this insertion of "Some New Ways of Thinking about Old Ideas," and the demand for a "reconstruction in philosophy" have been rather uncritically accepted as the sine qua non for philosophical greatness, even by Oppenheim. And yet Peirce did not aim for novelty so much as accuracy, seeking to find new words if necessary to underscore the inquiry of Plato, Aristotle, and Duns Scotus. Likewise Royce does not hold novelty as preciously as he does fidelity to truth, and even more so to a desire to explore such fidelity systematically. In a striking way the characters of Peirce and Royce reflect many of the dimensions of the relationship between Jonathan Edwards and Samuel Hopkins, his great systematizing student. Peirce and Edwards focus on discovering the truth, and both gravitate toward a universal characteristic that fructifies in their thought. Royce and Hopkins respond to this novel perspective, leaning toward the ethical implications and systematic expression to plumb the power of these ideas. For Hopkins it became disinterested benevolence to all, for Royce, loyalty to loyalty.

Oppenheim's book signals a change, I believe, in the contested story of American pragmatism. It represents an opening for a deeper exploration of the origins and meaning of pragmatism in relation to religion and in particular Christianity. It is impossible to dispute that pragmatism originated in relation to Christian ideas including James's rejection of his father's Absolute God, and Dewey's midlife rejection of his identification with Christianity, and beneath all Peirce's rather trinitarian categories of First, Second, and Third and the associated "universes of thought" from which one might be struck with the hypothesis of God. Oppenheim's work on Royce reflects both a desire to respond systematically to this neglected facet of pragmatism's story, and the desire to remain philosophically bound to a community; he wanted to speak truthfully and still talk to James, to be considered one of the pragmatists. Royce had to face his own question: What is the loyal thing to do? To abandon philosophical decorum and identify with the Absolute, irrespective of the costs to career and postion? To work within the pragmatic view to ameliorate the situation, responding point for point, seeking common ground rather than sharp and divisive distinctions? What Royce represents, his enduring contribution to American philosophy, is trust that the self-critical and correcting power of the community of philosophers will eventually overcome any errors of judgment or lack of charity. In the end, the Great Community will arrive in us.