Reverence: Renewing a Forgotten Virtue

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Woodruff, Paul, Reverence: Renewing a Forgotten Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2001, 256pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-514778-2.

Reviewed by Philip L. Quinn, University of Notre Dame


This ambitious and engaging book aims to restore to our ethical and political thought the idea of reverence. According to Paul Woodruff, we have not lost reverence itself, because it cannot disappear altogether from a functioning society. Hence, “we go on unconsciously doing reverent things, and this is fortunate, because the complete loss of reverence would be too grievous to bear” (p. 36). But we have forgotten what reverence is and why it is important. “What we have lost,” he declares, “is not reverence but the idea” (p. 37). His project is to retrieve the idea from the obscurity into which it has fallen and to foster in us an appreciation of its value. In pursuit of this goal, he mobilizes a formidable array of cultural resources. They include philosophical analysis and argument, texts from ancient Greece and China, English poetry of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, anecdotes about ordinary life and reflections on social institutions such as the military, the school and the home.

The book is divided into twelve chapters. Chapter 1 introduces Woodruff’s idea of reverence; he holds that it is a cardinal virtue. The definition he offers is that “reverence is the well-developed capacity to have the feelings of awe, respect, and shame when these are the right feelings to have” (p. 8). Chapter 2 gives examples of the absence of reverence. They include families that are too busy to have meals together, a woman who never votes on the grounds that her vote will make no difference to the outcome of elections and a father who slugs the umpire of his son’s baseball league. Woodruff uses such examples to suggest that there is a tight connection between reverence and a proper regard for ritual in common life. Chapter 3 gives examples of the presence of reverence. They are a performance of a Mozart quartet by four amateur musicians and an informal ceremony a group of students performs in memory of a dead friend.

Chapter 4 contains the book’s most significant theoretical argument. There Woodruff tries to show that “we can talk usefully about bare reverence—not reverence as it has been practiced in this or that traditional society, but reverence as dreamers anywhere could try to foster it in hopes of improving the quality of their lives” (pp.59-60). We must be able to talk about reverence in a way that rises above cultural differences if reverence is to be a cardinal virtue. Woodruff employs a comparison with courage to drive this point home. He asserts:

If courage is what we think it is, then Jewish courage is no different in kind from Christian or Buddhist courage; indeed, we would be silly to call it by such names. Courage is courage, regardless of the religion of those who display it. Reverence is the same; it straddles boundaries between religions and bridges the gap between religious and secular life (p. 67).

The next two chapters are devoted to explorations of the idea of reverence in ancient Greek and Chinese texts. Chapter 5 discusses the Greek concepts of hosiotês and eusebeia; its chief sources are Herodotus’s History, Homer’s Iliad, the Oedipus Tyrannus and Antigone of Sophocles and the Bacchae of Euripides. Chapter 6 focuses on the Confucian concept of Li; it covers material from the Analects and the Mencius.

In Chapter 7, Woodruff argues that reverence is not a specifically religious virtue. Since reverence must stand in awe of something, a reverent person must believe that “there is one Something that satisfies at least one of the following conditions: it cannot be changed or controlled by human means, is not fully understood by human experts, was not created by human beings, and is transcendent” (p. 117). But a reverent person need not believe that the object of reverence is a divinity or is fearsome or is perfect. So reverence requires nothing by way of belief “beyond an inarticulate trust that there is something of which we must stand in awe” (p.132). Woodruff finds reverence without a religious creed in Tennyson’s “In Memoriam.” Indeed, he boldly judges that poem to be “the finest expression of reverence that we have in the English language” (p. 118). Chapter 8 provides historical examples of reverence in a variety of religious and nonreligious contexts. Woodruff locates violent reverence in ancient Greek rituals of sacrifice and in the calls to God for vengeance in the biblical Psalms. He also discerns agnostic reverence in the works of Protagoras, Thucydides and Plato and in the Chinese humanism of the Confucian tradition. Chapter 9 defends Woodruff’s position against the charge of relativism. Its main point is that revering local customs or traditions instead of transcendent ideals such as truth, justice, freedom or God is a mistake, because mere custom can never be worthy of reverence.

The last three chapters concern the role of reverence in familiar social institutions. Chapter 10 is devoted to reflections on reverent leadership and discusses military leadership at some length. Chapter 11 focuses on reverence in the classroom. In both these cases, Woodruff considers reverence valuable both because it promotes respect on the part of those at the upper levels of the institutional hierarchy (colonels, professors) for those at the lower levels (lieutenants, undergraduates) and because it fosters awe at some larger purpose the institution is meant to serve. Chapter 12 is a meditation on what it takes to make a shelter into a home. It contains a striking comparison of the hero of Homer’s Odyssey, whose homecoming brings him contentment, and the hero of Tennyson’s “Ulysses,” who cannot rest from travel.

Woodruff has worked hard to make the book accessible and attractive to an audience that’s much broader than his fellow specialists in ancient Greek philosophy. The prose style is simple, direct and free of jargon; it sometimes rises to the level of eloquence. The large range of scholarship that he evidently commands is not obtrusive and never disrupts the flow of the main text. Scholarly details are neatly tucked away in endnotes. Yet the book does not oversimplify. Its argument is complex, stimulating and often controversial. I found it a real delight to read, and I enjoyed mulling over its contents after finishing it.

Some readers may object to the way in which Woodruff detaches reverence from religion. His claim that reverence requires no core of beliefs beyond an inarticulate trust that there is something awesome is plausible. However, reverence without a creed is not necessarily nonreligious. Christianity, which has historically defined its internal differences largely in terms of battles over orthodoxy, places great stock in creeds, confessions and the like. But other religions value correct practice more than correct belief. Some forms of Buddhism, which are usually classified as religious, demand at most minimal commitment to doctrinal beliefs. Closer to home, Reform Judaism promotes reverence without requiring much by way of theological belief from its practitioners. If our concept of religion is understood to be specified by family resemblances rather than necessary and sufficient conditions, we will be able to guard against the danger of privileging Christianity in determining what counts as a religion. We will tend be able to acknowledge the existence of religions without creeds and of religious reverence without extensive demands for orthodoxy. Hence Woodruff’s argument for nonreligious reverence does seem to rest on a somewhat parochial understanding of religion.

Nevertheless, I think Woodruff is on the right track when he insists that there are nonreligious forms of reverence. However, I would rest the case for this conclusion on a distinction between religious awe and aesthetic awe. It is appropriate to feel religious awe in response to experiences of what Rudolf Otto characterizes as the numinous in his The Idea of the Holy. It is also appropriate to feel aesthetic awe in response to experiences of what Immanuel Kant characterizes as the sublime in his Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime. Experiences of the sublime are typically evoked by such natural phenomena as vast spaces, great mountains and terrible storms. It is, of course, possible to interpret experiences of the sublime religiously. Kant said that the starry heavens above filled him with awe, and we are told that the heavens declare the glory of God. But experiences of the sublime often occur without religious interpretation. Yet it seems to me entirely proper for a philosophical naturalist to feel awe in the presence of the Grand Tetons or the Grand Canyon and to revere them for their sublimity.

My chief objection to Woodruff’s discussion concerns the use to which he puts his idea of bare reverence. I think it creates a bias that leads him to overemphasize similarities and neglect differences in his cross-cultural comparisons of Greek and Chinese forms of reverence. To be sure, he acknowledges that “no actual example of reverence or its violation is bare in my sense, because reverence always occurs within a culture” (p. 79). But he also insists that there cannot be different kinds of reverence if reverence is a cardinal virtue like courage. As we have seen, he asserts that it would be silly to speak of Christian courage or Buddhist courage. In my opinion, this is a very naive claim. It displays a failure to deal adequately with important methodological issues that must be confronted by comparative studies of the virtues.

As Lee H. Yearley has shown in his exemplary Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage (SUNY Press, 1990), fruitful comparisons of conceptions of courage will offer a balanced presentation of similarities and differences and will even attend to fine-grained similarities within the differences and differences within the similarities. Yearley’s work illuminates both similarities and differences between Confucian and Christian conceptions of courage; it also suggests that Confucian courage and Christian courage differ to a significant but limited extent. I would not be surprised to learn that there are comparable differences between Christian courage and Buddhist courage. During America’s war in Southeast Asia, Buddhist monks immolated themselves in protests against the government of South Vietnam. Many Americans found this shocking. They could not see these suicides as virtuous acts. Such acts could not count as examples of Christian courage because they were foolish if not sinful. Yet it is at least arguable that the self-immolation of these monks displayed Buddhist courage.

As I see things, Woodruff’s emphasis on the abstract idea of bare reverence and his demand for a single virtue of reverence in different cultures conspire to obscure differences both at the level of concepts and at the level of character. He does not attend to differences within similarities or similarities within differences. And so he does not take seriously enough the possibility that reverence is a family of analogously related character traits, not a single character trait instantiated in a variety of ancient and modern cultures.

Woodruff’s examples repeatedly raise the question of what role ritual and ceremony ought to play in our ordinary lives. He does not suffer from nostalgia for the ancient Greek and Chinese cultures he describes, and he is critical of going through the motions of empty rituals. But he is convinced that our lives are to some extent impoverished by a lack of reverent ceremony. He even claims that “modern antipathy to ceremony has prevented our coming to a full understanding of the classical Chinese tradition” (p. 41). My impression is that he thinks we would be better off living in a more ritualized society provided the rituals were animated by reverent feeling. I have doubts about this.

As Isaiah Berlin often reminded us, there is no social world without loss. I wonder what we would lose if we inhabited a social world that took rites more seriously than we do and worked hard to cultivate reverent feelings. Perhaps a hint can be gathered from some remarks Woodruff makes about reverence in the classroom. He says that “reverence in the classroom calls for a sense of awe in the face of truth and a recognition by teachers and students of their places in the order of learning” (p. 191). I remember being awestruck when I was first taught a proof of Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorem in a logic class, but most of the truth I have encountered in classrooms is of a more humdrum sort. The thought that such truth calls for awe strikes me as faintly ridiculous. And I doubt that there is an order of learning in which teachers and students have well defined places. Woodruff concludes his chapter on education with a paean to the silent teacher. He tells us:

The silent teacher shows the highest respect for students when sitting in reverential awe while the questioning voices fall into silence. The silent teacher truly respects students, but not because they are who they are. What lies behind the teacher’s respect is devotion to the truth, and it is devotion to the truth that, at this moment, draws teacher and students into the circle of mutual respect (p. 203).

This verbal picture of an ideal, teacher and students sitting silently, moved by devotion to truth to feelings of reverential awe, is remarkable. What is missing from it includes spontaneity, informality, flashes of wit, flights of fancy—in short, much of what makes actual classrooms lively and sometimes joyful places. The reverential classroom promises to be as solemn as a cathedral. And so too, as I see it, does a social world permeated with reverent ceremony.

My conclusion is that Woodruff exaggerates the attractions of reverence and the ceremonial milieu in which it is naturally expressed. But I am only in a position to make this judgment because his fine book succeeded in retrieving an idea of reverence, making it salient for me and impelling me to reflect on it. So I heartily recommend the book to anyone who is interested in thinking about human virtues either within the context of our own culture or from a comparative perspective.