Revolutionary Hope: Essays in Honor of William L. McBride

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Nathan Jun and Shane Wahl (eds.), Revolutionary Hope: Essays in Honor of William L. McBride, Lexington Books, 2013, 213pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739168738.

Reviewed by Steven Hendley, Birmingham-Southern College


This is a wide-ranging volume, as one might expect from a Festschrift. There are 13 essays in all from McBride's former students, colleagues, and friends, each of whom addresses, as Calvin O. Schrag aptly puts it in his contribution, "matters of content in the production of the work of the individual being honored, even if somewhat obliquely". (178) And so it is not surprising that we find essays on Sartre (most touch on Sartre's work in some way), especially his political philosophy. But we also find essays on, for instance, ecological concerns, feminism, globalization, intellectual freedom and, befitting McBride's most recent publications, events in Eastern Europe since 1989. Though the book lacks a unifying theme aside from that provided by McBride's own philosophical and political interests, there is something of a leitmotif running through several of the essays captured in the book's title, Revolutionary Hope: that of the persistence of hope in the broadly Marxian-Sartrean political ideals McBride has espoused throughout his life in the wake of contemporary political realities in which those ideals have become increasingly marginalized.

The question of hope is posed in the context of the temptation to despair. Nathan Jun and Shane Wahl preface their Introduction to the volume with a very brief quote they attribute to McBride on the occasion of Bush's re-election in 2004: "Abandon hope." (1) And many of the essays focus on different aspects of what Sonia Kruks characterizes in her essay quite simply as "our own 'dark times'" (106): increasing threats to academic freedom in the United States in the wake of the 9/11 attacks (Matthew Abraham, 7-20), the contemporary "ecological crisis," which Matthew Ally describes as "a crisis of nature that is a crisis of humanity," (21) the historical failure of the working class to become what Marx had envisioned as "self-conscious producers" of their own history (Leonard Harris, 81), McBride's own realistically informed pessimism about the prospects for an "existentially transformed social consciousness" (Martin Matuštík, 117) that would provide a fundamental form of resistance to the increasing dominance of what McBride calls "Coca-Cola culture," arising in the context of economic globalization (Sally Scholz, 157). And then there is the tragedy of the former Yugoslavia, which Matuštík recounts in his contribution. Of particular relevance to McBride, given his personal connection with the country, is what was once an "astonishingly successful evolution of socialism with a human face," which saw the defeat of its "1968 experiments in radical political and economic democracy" with the coming of the changes of 1989, eventually devolving into "the waking nightmare of Plato's bad democracy metastasizing into tyranny." (115-116) From the promise of worker self-management and praxis philosophy to the ethnic genocide of Slobodan Miloševič.

This theme of "dark times" is invoked in a more theoretical way in Kruk's. In an intriguing and uncommon reading of Sartre and Hannah Arendt together, she examines what we can learn from each about the fleeting nature of what Arendt called "spaces of freedom": spaces where the sort of "direct, face-to-face, political action" (92) valued by both can be sustained. Kruks considers Arendt's favored explanation in terms of the "intrusion of 'the social question', or 'necessity,'" but in the end finds it unsatisfactory to the extent that Arendt "presents necessity, or need, as an unfortunate side-issue; one that causes revolutions to deviate from their proper purpose when those who most suffer from want seize the center-stage." (102) Though she is sympathetic with the phenomenological need to distinguish work, labor, and action in the way Arendt does, she is critical of the way these distinctions lead Arendt to conceive of "spaces of freedom" as independent of work and labor, as "wholly free of necessity and of the material world." (99) Sartre's understanding of how all praxis, regardless of how it phenomenologically presents itself to us, is prone to reification by virtue of its material embodiment in a world of others gives us a better grasp of the fleeting nature of "spaces of freedom." Material necessity is not a "side-issue" which can divert free action from its proper course. It is a "dynamic 'internal' to the very spaces of freedom themselves that tends toward processes of alteration and reification." (103) Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason demonstrates how the "group-in-fusion" can free itself of the passivity of the "practico-inert," but also how that moment of shared active freedom must inevitably sink back into passivity as it seeks to maintain its collective reality as a group. Kruks notes how even a group such as Greenpeace must "stabilize itself as an institution in ways that are inimical to freedom for most of the individuals involved with it" so as "effectively to pursue its goals." (105) "Dark times" in which freedom is on the wane, it appears, will always be with us.

Kruks sees things a bit differently, however. "One may read Arendt here as saying, like Sartre, that we should not hope to 'achieve' or 'arrive at' a condition of free political action." (106) But the death of this species of hope, hope for an institutionalized form of freedom, is not the death of hope itself; "taken collectively and over time, as they each emerge and dissipate, such instances (of spaces of freedom) constitute an ongoing force of contestation and site for freedom." (106) Such is, perhaps, the theoretical basis for what Matuštík characterizes as McBrides's "hope against hope" (119), despite the failure of the promise exhibited in the Yugoslavia of the late sixties. We see much the same thought behind Wahl's own contribution to the volume in which he places his hope in a group pledged to "play," to resist "succumbing to set-in-stone structures and forms of hierarchy found in organizations relying on the division of labor." (200) Wahl closes the book by stressing a point also emphasized in the first essay by Ally, which opens the book to the importance of imagination in the maintenance of hope. "This is the hope in human imagination and the creation of new values and new understandings of values." (200) As our actions become reified in increasingly "practico-inert" structures, our capacity to imagine new ways of organizing our social life is itself an expression of freedom.

Focusing our hope on the possible re-emergence of necessarily fleeting "spaces of freedom" seems needlessly limiting, though. More consideration should be given to Arendt's idea that the mediation of action by a world of material things need not always lead to a reification of action, but may "enable free action to take place." (Kruks, 93) This is not actually a thought that is inimical to Sartre who did not, in all cases, equate material passivity and necessity with the reification of free action. In the Critique, Sartre characterizes the functional distribution of tasks in an organized group as an "active passivity," "the obverse" of the "passive activity" we find in the "practico-inert." To the extent that this functional structure is maintained by the members of the group as necessary to the realization of their shared goals, we can speak of the forms of material necessity it introduces into the group as enabling the common freedom of the organized group. It is only when the group becomes "powerless to change it without completely disrupting itself" that it becomes alienating, in what Sartre characterizes as an institution. (Critique of Dialectical Reason, Volume 1, trans. Alan Sheridan-Smith (London: NLB, 1976), 489 & 602) There is a tendency, I believe, among readers of Sartre's Critique to identify the group-in-fusion as a sort of high water mark of freedom in comparison to which every other form of social practice must involve a loss or degradation of the freedom we find in that fleeting moment. But that overlooks the way the functional structures of organized groups do not constitute a degradation of freedom, but the inert skeleton utilized by a group in its shared practice, the "active passivity," which enables that practice to persist beyond the fleeting moment of the group-in-fusion. There is, perhaps, something problematic about the idea of institutionalizing freedom, but we should not come to envision every form of division of labor and form of hierarchy arising on that basis to constitute, even to some degree, a loss of freedom. Organizations like Greenpeace do not necessarily compromise freedom but may create organized spaces within civil society in which free activity can persist. "Spaces of freedom" are not necessarily as fleeting, even for Sartre, as the example of the group-in-fusion might suggest. There is a broader scope for hope even in today's "dark times."

As I mentioned earlier, this volume includes essays on a wide range of topics, and not all of them relate to the theme of hope, at least not obviously. Though space will not permit a consideration of all the essays in this latter category that deserve consideration, two in particular, both from well established Sartre scholars, stand out. Thomas Flynn's "The Humanisms of Jean-Paul Sartre" recounts the various forms of humanism Sartre rejected and advanced in the course of his life. In particular, Flynn has Bernard Henri-Lévy's claim that there were two Sartres in his critical sights: the early, good Sartre of Nausea and Being and Nothingness, who was anti-humanist and the later, bad Sartre of the Critique and other later writings, who was a humanist and totalitarian. Flynn ably documents how Lévy ignores a continuing hostility to bourgeois humanism throughout Sartre's work and fails to see how the so-called totalitarian Sartre accords "a primacy, ontological, epistemic, and moral, to 'free organic praxis' of individuals." (65) Concluding, he outlines the parameters of a properly Sartrean or "dialectical" humanism, which Lévy leaves unconsidered and which can be summed up in the "mantra . . . a man can always make something out of what is made of him." (62)

Ronald Santoni's contribution, the one essay that, as the author himself notes, departs from the "primary scholarship" (138) of both his and McBride's work, is a thoughtful critique of Albert Camus' idea of rebellion as a response to the absurd. In his characteristic way, Santoni carefully documents the case both for Camus' atheism as well as a more ambivalent attitude toward religion, concluding that though Camus may have been more of an agnostic than an atheist, he still rejected "the idea of a Christian God" as an omnipotent creator of the world. (143) But then, as he repeatedly asks, "What sense does it make to rebel against and have anger towards a creation that, allegedly, does not have a 'creator'" (139). One must credit Santoni for bending over backwards to find an answer to this question that would redeem Camus' position, but in the end he concludes that it just does not make good sense. On a positive note, he ends with a sketch of a more sensible existential response to the absurd that, as he effectively argues, does not merit the term "rebellion."

To close, it would be negligent not to mention the portrait of McBride collectively sketched by the more personal reflections in this volume. One takes away the image of a philosopher whose professional work has always been informed by lived experience. "Lived experience is to me the origin of much of what is valuable in philosophy" (McBride, quoted in Matuštík, 119). Centered in lived experience, McBride's work "transcend[s] disciplinary and methodological fetishism" (Lewis Gordon, 72) and has been engaged, in the Sartrean sense of that term, in the political struggles of his time, especially with "the enormous disparities between rich and poor nations and individuals" (McBride, quoted in Jun and Wahl, 4), but also with feminism and with recent events in Eastern Europe. Others comment on the global character of his philosophy as an outgrowth of the international character of his own lived experience. Beyond his academic work proper, McBride leaves a legacy of leadership in many philosophical associations. He co-founded the North American Sartre Society, served as President of the Société Americaine de Philosophie de Langue Française, and Secretary General of the Fédération Internationale des Sociétés de Philosophie. And, finally, one is left with the impression of a generous teacher, colleague, and friend, seriously committed to social justice, but not without the ability to step back and laugh at the "total mess of things" (Wahl, 197) we frequently find in the world. Those who know McBride or his work will find in Revolutionary Hope a true celebration of his life and work, which invites further inquiry into the questions with which he has been engaged.