Richard Rorty: From Pragmatist Philosophy to Cultural Politics

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Alexander Gröschner, Colin Koopman, and Mike Sandbothe (eds.), Richard Rorty: From Pragmatist Philosophy to Cultural Politics, Bloomsbury, 2013, 205pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441154262.

Reviewed by Chauncey Maher, Dickinson College


There are more than twenty single-authored books or edited collections on the work of Richard Rorty.[1] So, it is natural to wonder: does the present volume offer something new and helpful?[2] The book does not have a tight focus; instead, the essays address various themes concerning pragmatism and cultural politics. One recurring theme (appearing in pieces by Robert Brandom, Bjørn Ramberg, Colin Koopman, Esa Saarinen, and Richard Shusterman) is whether and how Rorty's work as a whole exhibits an interesting unity. Except for the essays by Brandom and Shusterman, the essays are generally not critical of Rorty. Some of the essays are much better than others. Although the editors themselves do not say, the book appears to be for people who are already familiar with Rorty's work, but are not necessarily experts on it. Others would do better focusing on one of the other collections on Rorty.[3]

In this review, I will highlight those essays that seem to me especially interesting or problematic, closing with a thought on future work on Rorty.

In "An Arc of Thought: From Rorty's Eliminative Materialism to His Pragmatism," Brandom connects Rorty's now classic argument for eliminative materialism with Rorty's notorious arguments against the idea of objective reality. Very roughly, Brandom contends that Rorty's strategies on both topics are deeply similar, but that his arguments against the idea of objective reality are too hasty. Brandom holds that Rorty's strategy has two parts: first, show how metaphysical commitments (such as commitment to the existence of the mind, as somehow distinct from mere material objects) are held in place by linguistic practices; second, show how those linguistic practices are optional and could be, given suitable developments, replaced by better linguistic practices. Regarding the mind, the basic idea is that "incorrigibility is the mark of the mental," but incorrigibility is, at bottom, an aspect of our practices of talking about the mind -- about one's own mind and the minds of others. We can imagine a future in which each person is not incorrigible in judgments about her own mental states, a future in which we do not, by default, defer to each person when she says what she is thinking or feeling, perhaps because we have developed "cerebroscopes." Regarding objective reality, the goal would be to identify what sorts of talk are characteristic of talking of objective reality, and then to show that this sort of talk might turn out to be less than the best way for us to deal with the world and each other. Brandom thinks that we are much less clear about objective-reality-talk than we are about mind-talk. Thus, contra Rorty, he thinks it is an open question whether we could do without it.

In "The Contingent Status of Epistemic Norms: Rorty, Kantian Pragmatisms, and Feminist Epistemologies," Susan Dieleman argues that the best way to understand Rorty on epistemic norms is to compare and contrast his views with the closely related views of Habermas and Putnam. Rorty, Habermas, and Putnam agree that there is some crucial way in which epistemic norms -- standards regarding evidence, justification and deference -- are contingent and dependent on human practices. But Rorty disagrees with both of them about the extent and character of that contingency and dependence. More specifically, according to Dieleman, both Habermas and Putnam think that to allow for and make sense of the possibility of criticizing one's own epistemic norms, one must appeal to some sort of ideal circumstances. Rorty disagrees. For him, appeals to ideal circumstances are just disguised appeals to what one particular person or group thinks of as better reasons. Instead, challenging and defending epistemic norms can only be the messy business of negotiating claims to the better reason from our partial points of view. By contrasting Rorty with Putnam and Habermas, Dieleman offers a good way to understand Rorty's take on epistemic norms.[4] A good way to further that understanding would be to consider also the views of Rorty's former student Michael Williams.[5]

A similar theme emerges in "Pragmatist Philosophy and Enlarging Human Freedom: Rorty's Deweyan Pragmatism," by Christopher Voparil, who contends that Rorty's idea of philosophy as cultural politics should be seen as an attempt to borrow from and improve on Dewey. On Voparil's reading, Rorty agrees with Dewey that we should care first and foremost about building better lives and communities. They also agree that doing so requires making room for criticism of one's own cultural norms. However, while Dewey thinks this ultimately forces one to appeal to some kind of trans-cultural authority (e.g., a general story about intelligence), Rorty thinks it does not require that, and that we should not give in to that temptation. All we have are appeals to the norms we have; we have to negotiate on the fly. Voparil concludes that "Rorty is cashing out Dewey's own insights about the culturally-situated context of inquiry," thereby "advancing" pragmatist philosophy (122).

In "For the Sake of His Own Generation: Rorty on Deconstruction and Edification," Ramberg clarifies the place of edification in Rorty's thinking about what philosophy can and should do. In Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Rorty famously exhorts philosophers to engage in edification. In Mirror, edification is the main alternative to constructive, systematic, or "normal" philosophy, which Rorty thinks has centered on foundationalist epistemology for at least the past four hundred years. More positively, edification involves mainly turning "the conversation of mankind" in new and fruitful directions. Ramberg says this idea is, at best, "undeveloped" in Mirror (59). Ramberg contends that in Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, Rorty develops the idea of edification with his image of the "ironist," someone who worries that she is born into the wrong community, or into the wrong way of speaking, and therefore wonders about and tries to learn other ways of living, thinking, and talking, ways that are not merely foisted on her. Rorty thinks our challenge is to be both ironic and liberal, where being liberal means thinking "cruelty is the worst thing we do." More plainly, the challenge is to pursue self-creation while learning how to talk with others who are (perhaps deeply) different from us. These ideas, Ramberg believes, give personal, ethical and political substance to Rorty's earlier idea of edification. Ramberg does not, however, address Rorty's own claim that he abandoned the idea of edification, rather than clarified it. In his autobiographical essay in the volume for the Library of Living Philosophers, for instance, Rorty writes, "the contrast I drew there [in Mirror] between 'systematic' and 'edifying' philosophy was not the one I wanted" (13). And: "[In later work] I dropped the awkward 'systematic' vs. 'edifying' distinction I had drawn in Mirror" (13).

Rorty's positive proposal for philosophy is also taken up in "Pragmatism and Cultural Politics: Variations on a Rortyan Theme," by Shusterman. He argues that Rorty should not be so hostile to theorizing about experience, especially bodily experience. According to Shusterman, Rorty is hostile to theorizing about experience because Rorty thinks it is typically a manifestation of epistemological foundationalism, which is, roughly, the idea that there is a foundation of knowledge, one which is identifiable by uniquely philosophical means (such as introspection, transcendental critique, phenomenology, or conceptual analysis). Rorty is hostile to foundationalism because (a) there is no special philosophical method that could find a foundation of knowledge, and (b) knowledge does not need a foundation. Shusterman contends, however, that one can theorize about experience -- in particular, bodily experience -- without endorsing epistemological foundationalism. More precisely, one can critically examine the "values, forms of knowledge, and disciplines of practice that structure" the way we treat our bodies without hoping to establish that our experience of bodies is in any way a foundation of knowledge (175). Shusterman further contends that theorizing about the body seems consistent with Rorty's idea of "philosophy as cultural politics." Specifically, Rorty says the root aim of philosophy as cultural politics is to make a "difference to the way human beings live" (Rorty 2007, p. x; cited at 177). Shusterman says that critically examining the way we treat bodies, our own and others, is certainly consistent with that; it might even be necessary for it.

In "Challenging Philosophy: Rorty's Positive Conception of Philosophy as Cultural Criticism," Koopman contends that throughout his career, Rorty was not trying to end philosophy, but trying only to end (or signal the end) of a certain type of philosophy, and to propose doing another sort of philosophy in its place. He then provides "a barrage of textual evidence" for that claim from six different texts written at different points in Rorty's career (82). While I agree with Koopman's claim, it also does not seem especially in need of asserting. (In a footnote appended to a sentence roughly seven pages into his essay, Koopman hints that the main person to whom he is responding is Voparil.) As Koopman himself shows, Rorty repeatedly claims that he wants to move away from philosophy of a certain sort (centered on foundationalist epistemology, and the idea that philosophy has a special method), towards some sort of philosophy that is both more tractable and valuable to human lives. Unfortunately, however, Koopman relies on a dubious rhetorical device, saying that "nearly everyone today" insists that Rorty is not a philosopher (76; see also 79). Koopman mentions in particular only Joseph Margolis (78). (Saarinen does something similar, writing "Rorty is often . . . charged with not being a true or real philosopher" (145).) Given that since 2000, at least nine books devoted to Rorty's work have been written or edited by philosophers, Koopman is seriously exaggerating the number of people who think Rorty is not a philosopher.

In "Kindness to Babies and Other Radical Ideas: Rorty's Anti-Cynical Philosophy," Saarinen asks, "Is Rorty really not a real philosopher?" (145). He then attempts to explain why Rorty is a real philosopher, and more so than "professional" (147) or "academic" (148) philosophers, who allegedly refuse Rorty that title. Saarinen contends that Rorty is a real philosopher because, like Socrates but unlike "professional" philosophers, he thinks that philosophy can and should help people live better lives (148-9). Does it matter whether Rorty really is a real philosopher? Most of the philosophers who actually disagree with Rorty do not seem to care whether he is a real philosopher. (Just look at the volumes edited by Brandom, Charles Guignon and David Hiley, and Randalle Auxier and Lewis Hahn.) Instead, they contend that his arguments do not work, or that his assumptions are false, or that his interpretations are bad.[6] Saarinen provides no compelling evidence that all or even most professional philosophers think Rorty is not a real philosopher.

Given that Saarinen talks about hardly any professional philosophers, he is excessively presumptuous about what they care about. I will use this to make a substantive point about what Rorty sometimes says philosophers should care about. Rorty wants philosophers to give up the attempt to develop a uniquely philosophical method in order to secure our contact with objective reality. Instead, he variously proposes that they should engage in "edification" or "cultural politics." But, as Richard Bernstein pointed out in an early essay on Mirror, Rorty seems to be offering a false choice.[7] Furthermore -- and this is something that Bernstein was not yet in a position to say -- many current philosophers are not concerned with identifying a uniquely philosophical method in service of securing our contact with reality. Instead, they spend time working shoulder to shoulder with colleagues in neighboring disciplines, trying to understand, for instance, how brains or cities or aid-programs or languages actually work (or might work best). Interestingly, that work is not obviously what Rorty calls edification or cultural politics, yet it nevertheless is plausibly part of an effort to better human lives. In this way, many contemporary philosophers have found a way to agree with Rorty about the sort of philosophy we should leave behind, while nevertheless disagreeing with him about how to do philosophy in a way that betters human lives.

What does the future hold for work on Rorty? It has been more than six years since he passed away. In one very real way, we can no longer converse with him. It would be extremely ironic -- and unfortunate -- if work on Rorty became mainly an effort to say systematically and carefully what he really meant, or should have said. (Forget about whether he was a real philosopher.) A better, more interesting, and certainly more fitting future for work on Rorty would have people critically engaging his claims, arguments, and interpretations, thereby continuing the best sort of conversations with Rorty.[8]

[1] The editors mention that this book has an "ancestor" in German: Pragmatismus als Kulturpolitik (Berlin: Suhrkamp, 2011). The present book replaces some pieces from that ancestor. The editors do not specify which is which, so allow me to do so. In both books are pieces by Habermas, Brandom, Ramberg, Saarinen, Sassen, and Shusterman. New to this book are pieces by Dieleman, Koopman, and Voparil. Authors from the ancestor who do not appear in this book: A. MacIntyre, R. Bernstein, B. Allen, and Leggewie and Zifonun.

[2] For a helpful but incomplete list see "Secondary Literature" in Ramberg, "Richard Rorty," Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (June 16, 2007).

[3] For instance, Brandom (ed.), Rorty and His Critics (New York: Blackwell, 2000); Guignon and Hiley (eds.), Richard Rorty (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003), Auxier and Hahn (eds.), The Philosophy of Richard Rorty (La Salle: Open Court, 2010).

[4] For a similar and helpful take not cited by Dieleman, see the piece by G. Gutting in Guignon and Hiley 2003.

[5] See, for instance, the pieces by Williams himself in Brandom 2000, and Guignon and Hiley 2003.

[6] For instance, Brandom 2000, Guignon and Hiley 2003, and Auxier and Hahn 2010.

[7] Bernstein, "Philosophy in the Conversation of Mankind," The Review of Metaphysics 33.4 (1980): 745-775. See especially §V.

[8] Thanks to Susan Feldman, Nat Hansen and Zed Adams for their helpful suggestions.