Richard Rorty: The Making of an American Philosopher

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Neil Gross, Richard Rorty: The Making of an American Philosopher, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 390pp., $32.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780226309903.

Reviewed by Barry Allen, McMaster University


This book is neither a biography nor a critical study of Rorty's ideas. It has very substantial biographical portions, but in intention it differs from either biography or philosophical study. The book is a contribution to the sociology of ideas, and proposes to "use Rorty's biography as a case study by means of which to push the sociology of ideas in new directions." Neil Gross is mainly interested in the early part of Rorty's career, the work that first drew him to the world's attention. The biography ends in 1982, with Rorty's departure from Princeton.

Gross tells the story of Rorty's parents, James Rorty and Winifred Raushenbush. The father was a socialist, anti-Communist, poet, and sometime ad-man, author of Our Master's Voice: Advertising (1934), as well as a couple of volumes of poetry. As a "New York intellectual," he wrote and published independently of the academic world. He and his peers were intellectual generalists, scornful of specialization and the academic distinctions that isolate art, politics, literature, and social theory. And like so many of these peers James Rorty was a Trotskyite, which for them was more a socialist's way of being anti-Stalin than an enthusiasm for the man Trotsky.

Winifred Raushenbush, Rorty's mother, was born into Christian socialist politics. She rated the Sacco and Vanzetti case as the decisive event of her childhood. She collaborated with urban sociologist Robert Park at the University of Chicago, and wrote for numerous leftist and mainstream periodicals. "I was brought up a Trotskyite," Rorty says. Gross depicts an early family life (Rorty was an only child) of high literacy, political passion, and analysis. They were a pretty close family, always reading books, newspapers, periodicals, and each other's writings, and arguing events of the day with notable intellectual family friends.

The biography touches very lightly on Rorty's growing up, and doesn't hit its stride until young Richard goes to college at the University of Chicago at age fifteen. He wrote highly literate and affectionate letters to his parents, discussing philosophy, politics, and his plans and ambitions, especially after his discovery of philosophy. He turned to therapy in a rough patch when he got two Cs in philosophy. He stayed on at Chicago to complete an MA (1949-52). His thesis was on Whitehead, supervised by Charles Hartshorne. Despite the presence of Carnap, the philosophy department at Chicago under Richard McKeon held out against positivism and what would become analytic philosophy. The young Rorty enthusiastically self-identified as one of the holdouts, writing to his mother of "the little clique of reactionary metaphysicians (the rank to which I aspire) who are trying to stop the positivist invasion."

Rorty was turned down for doctoral work by Harvard, and accepted to Yale (1952-56). Yale was then a department rather like Chicago in counting itself opposed to the inroads of logical positivism in American philosophy. It was also one of the few places where the pragmatic philosophers were still taken seriously. For his dissertation (supervised by Paul Weiss) Rorty chose the topic of potentiality. He surveyed a large sweep of historical ideas from classical and medieval thought, and traced the problem into logical positivism, where he was able to show the conspicuous weakness of the positivists' treatment, and made plausible the suggestion that positivism has something to learn from the metaphysics it crassly wanted to eliminate.

After a term of draft service in the army Rorty got his first academic position at Wellesley College (1958-61). He threw himself into two lines of research. One was the effort to translate between analytic and nonanalytic philosophy. Eventually Rorty came to side with the analysts, but argued as an analytic philosopher that his discipline would be enhanced by taking nonanalytic work seriously. The second project was to advance the case for the relevance of pragmatism to analytic philosophy. The alliance with pragmatism therefore came early in Rorty's career, and was not something he took up after the break with analytic philosophy.

Wilfrid Sellars was a crucial resource for Rorty from this early point. As Gross tells it, Rorty was drawn to Sellars' work because it was anti-positivist, though unlike the later Wittgenstein not deconstructive, offering instead highly constructive and historically nuanced solutions to acknowledged problems in analytic philosophy.

Rorty joined the philosophy department at Princeton, then chaired by Gregory Vlastos, in 1961. He received tenure in 1965 and was promoted to full professor in 1970. A nation-wide push for rigor and scientificity, even (or especially) in the humanities, was underway and strongly represented in the Princeton department. Rorty began to enter contemporary analytic debates, particularly in the philosophy of mind. He also took up the new subject of metaphilosophy. The question that used to concern him about how to get analytic and nonanalytic together now took the form of a new question: why be analytic, why take the linguistic turn? Rorty's first book was an edited collection of the major responses to this question by the leaders of "the linguistic revolution in philosophy." Gross suggests that it was in writing his substantial introductory essay to the collection, published as The Linguistic Turn (1967), that Rorty began to formulate the argument of Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), which Gross thinks is largely thought out by the mid-1970s.

These same years see the rise of the New Left and campus radicalism. Rorty had been an anti-Communist leftist red-baiter since childhood, and the politics of the New Left seemed to him pretty naive, though he kept his skepticism among friends, as in this letter to Milton Fisk in 1971: "I think that nothing but a revolution in the country is going to make it possible for millions of people to lead a decent life, but I still don't want a revolution in this country -- simply because I'm afraid of finding something worse when the revolution is over."

By the time Rorty had tenure he was growing disdainful of business as usual in analytic philosophy, especially Princeton style. Complacency was his main complaint. He came to believe that analytic philosophy overdid rigor and specialization, dooming itself to intellectual isolation and cultural indifference. Around this time he joined an important circle meeting at Princeton's Institute for Advanced Study, which included his friends Thomas Kuhn, Clifford Geertz, and Quinton Skinner. The IAS group functioned as an alternative intellectual reference group, supporting Rorty's exploration of historicism and his growing skepticism about analytic philosophy.

Gross dwells on the pluralist controversy at the Eastern APA meeting in 1979, the year of Rorty's APA presidency. He was a friend of the pluralists and instinctively wanted to mediate but was shocked by the intensity of hostility from the analysts, whose violent reaction convinced Rorty that the pluralists are right about something. In his presidential address that year, which was of course composed without knowing how the pluralist controversy would play out, he predicted sweeping changes in analytic philosophy. The practice of philosophy in America was about to change, he said, and a renascent pragmatism will lead the way.

Rorty was given a MacArthur Foundation award in 1981, and the next year left Princeton (and philosophy departments) for a humanities professorship at the University of Virginia. Rorty said the move was "like the break-up of a long-standing, chilly marriage." At this point the biographical portion of Gross' book ends.

Gross wants us to think of his book as a contribution to a "new" sociology of ideas. The old sociology attempts to deduce the individual from the group, regarding a thinker's ideas as an unconscious expression of a prevailing structure, whether of economy, ideology, or libido.

The new sociology of ideas, as I gather from Gross’s book, is a theory of the influences operating on intellectual choice, especially in the humanities. The leading contributions to this new sociology all make sociological studies of philosophy and philosophers -- Pierre Bourdieu in Homo Academicus and a book on Heidegger; Randall Collins in The Sociology of Philosophies, and now Gross’s book. The goal is a theory of the social factors that influence the ideas intellectuals take seriously and how they manage their careers. There is no expectation of uncovering general laws, but Gross believes there are "social mechanisms" to be found that probablize outcomes.

For Bourdieu, ideas are strategic; preference for ideas is one way people distinguish and position themselves in an academic hierarchy. For Collins, access to high-status networks is the key intellectual resource and major determinate of why "great thinkers" think as they do. Gross' contribution is to assert the influence of intellectual self-concept, the quest for self-concept coherence. In other words philosophers sometimes argue as they do because of their beliefs about who they are and what they want to accomplish. They gravitate toward ideas that synthesize the stories they tell others about who they are and their theoretical expressions. On this account the causes for our taking seriously the ideas we do are not all behind our backs, as Bourdieu and Collins, like Marx and Freud, say. Individuals matter, consciousness matters, the self matters. Very reassuring, romantic, and American. The new sociology confirms the old ideology.

That is the proposition in support of which Gross enlists Rorty's biography. He identifies three facets of self-concept in Rorty: Leftist American patriot, a legacy of his parents; resister of positivism, from graduate school; and exemplary professional, from the early Princeton years. He correlates these moments of selfhood with developments in Rorty's life: the choice of Yale for doctoral work and of his dissertation topic, the determination to become a "good" analytic philosopher, and the decision to leave professional philosophy for the role of an interdisciplinary intellectual, self-identifying, as Rorty increasingly did, as a leftist American patriot.

Rigorism, hyperbolic professionalization, swept through the US universities, especially in the humanities, as Rorty got his first tenure-track appointment. Rorty rode this wave successfully to tenure at Princeton, only to emerge as a leader of the anti-rigorism of the 1980s. This anti-foundational movement was partly an American take on current French Theory. The ideas chimed with Rorty's parental inheritance in rejecting scientism and promoting interdisciplinarity; he neatly linked lessons from his parents with the new antifoundationalism by advancing American pragmatism as a philosophy that accomplishes everything French Theory does without Hegel and Marx.

Theories of academic strategy might have sociological explanations for Rorty's choice of graduate school and dissertation topic, and he was at his most conformist to disciplinary structures in his embrace of analytic philosophy during the first years at Princeton. He made all the right moves. But the economy of academic prestige can explain only so much. With tenure secure, Rorty stopped being strategic and started "to do work that really mattered to him and that he saw as consistent with his most deeply held values and identities." To go all the way, then, in sociological explanation we have to endow the self with agency. Rorty ended his life as he began, a leftist American patriot, endowing this description with a new resonance, at least for Americans, that it hadn't had since the time of his parents and the heyday of "New York intellectuals."

I think any philosopher or student of philosophy will enjoy reading the biographical parts of this book. Rorty granted Gross access to his papers and correspondence, and Gross uses this material very effectively, with generous quotations from letters to parents, friends, editors, deans, presidents of foundations, and so on. This inside view of one of the most well-connected academics in the world can't help but fascinate us. But to read the whole book with the same interest requires one to suspend disbelief in "social mechanisms" that nudge thinkers to their ideas, and to care somewhat about prospects for a new and improved sociology of ideas.