Richard Rorty

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Guignon, Charles and Hiley, David (eds.), Richard Rorty, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 222pp, $20.00 (pbk) , ISBN 0521804892.

Reviewed by Pascal Engel, Universite Paris, Sorbonne


There is something of Dr. Jekyll and Mr. Hyde about Richard Rorty. Who is who is relative to the philosophical angle from which you consider the strange case. Dr. Richard is a former analytic philosopher, who has not completely parted company with the heirs of Frege, Carnap and Quine, who has produced important challenges to a number of conceptions in analytic philosophy and who has renewed Deweyan pragmatism and political liberalism in interesting ways. Mr. Rorty is one of the leading figures of post-modernist culture, a radical sceptic and relativist, producing a bland synthesis of Nietzscheism, Heideggerianism, deconstructionism and pragmatism, and who assimilates philosophy to literature and conversation. Of course if one turns the tables, from the other side of the fence which divides contemporary philosophical culture, the description is reversed. As Jean Elshtain says in this volume, Richard Rorty is the antiphilosopher’s philosopher. We can add that he is, more interestingly, the philosopher’s antiphilosopher.

That things are not so simple is witnessed by the fact that, in spite of his contempt for arguments, Richard Rorty’s views have led to active discussions in the usual style of academic exchange of objections and replies, in particular in such collective volumes as Allan Malachowski’s Reading Rorty, Robert Brandom’s Rorty and his Critics, and in the present one from the Cambridge series Philosophers in focus. In spite of the fact that he has himself often taken sides for Derrida, Foucault or Heidegger, and defended a number of post-modernist themes, Rorty does not fit well within the group of writers usually associated with such trends. Because he writes clearly and straightforwardly he could not figure in the anthology of French bullshitting that Sokal and Bricmont have compiled1 . In his political writings, he has no particular indulgence for the American Left, who often associated itself with post-modernist themes.

To the taste of the present reviewer, it is fortunate that this volume is more on the Dr. Richard side, like the previous collection edited by Robert Brandom (Rorty and his Critics, Blackwell, 2000), and unlike some other earlier collections on Mr. Rorty. Nevertheless, it is interesting that a number of writers here put the stress of the double-edged character of a number of his views.

In their introduction, the editors give a clear and useful survey of the many facets of Rorty’s writings, from his neopragmatist critique of contemporary epistemology and philosophy of mind to his unconventional liberal defense of democracy. They identify correctly the difficulties of criticizing Rorty and of playing with him the usual game of exchanging arguments. In the first round, Rorty attempts to undercut some traditional philosophical thesis – Platonism, Foundationalism, Representationalism, etc. (always a capital letter!) – with the intention to show that a) everyone in the tradition and on the contemporary scene more or less subscribes to it2 ), b) that it rests upon some mythological conception (e.g. the Given, Reality in itself) or upon some false dualism which has been debunked by some Great Figure (e.g.: “ Since Heidegger, Dewey and Davidson we know that…”), or c) by taking an extreme counterposition, “a tactic that seems to suggest that all positions on the topic are somewhat arbitrary” (p.30). If the opponent protests that the so-called thesis has been caricatured, and that one can nevertheless give some reasonable defense of the attacked thesis, free of the so-called mythological implications, then Rorty redescribes his opponent’s position to make it trivially true or outright false. Or he practices ignoratio elenchi. In the second round, when the opponent objects that this is not good argument, then Rorty admits that he does not care for argument, which is useless and counterproductive and claims that what matters is only the attempt to demythologise and to put forward new ways of thinking. And he adds that in so objecting the opponent is in the grip of one of the mythologies and wrong dualisms that he is denouncing - a belief in some antecedently given Truth of the Matter or some Objective Point View. The game can go on, without there being anything much to do but to admire the artist. Be that as it may, each of the contributors in this volume bravely and honestly attempts to evaluate Rorty’s views. The volume contains two papers devoted to Rorty’s views on epistemology (Garry Gutting and Michael Williams). Joseph Rouse examines his views on science and its relations to society and culture. Three papers (Georgia Warnke, Richard Bernstein and Jean Bethke Elshtain) deal with his political views. Charles Taylor closes the volume with an analysis of Rorty’s views on philosophy. There is an extensive bibliography of Rorty’s writings and a useful list of secondary sources.

Gary Gutting lucidly describes the main themes of Rorty’s critique of epistemology. If, as he points out, the debunking of the classical and contemporary foundationalist theories of justification leads to the view that giving reasons amounts to satisfying our peers, then justification is just a social practice, and, given that, for Rorty, truth does not differ much from justification, then there is nothing more to justification than social agreement (“epistemological behaviorism”). Rorty is thus open to the familiar objections against consensus theories of justification and of truth: Socrates can be right against the Athenians, intersubjectivity and objectivity do not coincide. Gutting, however, argues that this kind of objection rests upon a confusion—which Rorty himself sometimes makes—between conforming to a social norm or practice and agreeing with the group: I can follow the norms of a community even though the community does not reach any consensus about them. It is not, according to Gutting—who here agrees with Charles Taylor—explicit acceptance of norms, but the implicit understanding of a shared social practice which is the ultimate source of justification of our beliefs. Gutting makes a similar objection to Rorty’s treatment of truth: his desire to get rid of the notion of Truth (in the Transcendent sense) and of the scheme/content dualism betrays an adherence to the representational picture that the aims to reject (a tu quoque argument!). According to Gutting, Rorty would be more inspired if he adopted a form of common-sense realism, by accepting both the platitudinous truths of everyday life and the platitudinous truths about truth. The point is well taken, but it raises some difficulties, which can be presented in the form of a dilemma. On the one hand, in order to make sense as a coherent alternative to Rorty’s view, humdrum realism must be a form of realism, and not simply the platitudinous recognition that our conceptions are true whenever things are the way they are said to be. In other words, humdrum realism has to acknowledge that truth is distinct from justification, and that one (or rather we) can be justified in believing that P, although P is false. But this is precisely what Rorty denies. On the other hand, if humdrum realism is but a version of the deflationary conception of truth, it is not clear that it is a form of realism at all. Gutting suggests that Arthur Fine’s “natural ontological attitude” or Horwich’s minimalism are views along this line. Rorty himself has often expressed his commitment to some deflationist theory of truth, most often the so-called “performative” version that he nicely expresses by saying that truth is but a “compliment” that we pay to our assertions. But apart from the fact that the various forms of deflationism are not equivalent, they are saddled with difficulties.3 In particular it is not clear that truth-minimalism, especially in Rorty’s form, is able to account for the fact that truth is a norm of assertion. As Michael Williams notes here (p.72), Rorty actually does not accept any form of humdrum or commonsense realism, for “the opposite of irony is commonsense”. In any case, if he adopted Gutting’s recommendation to become a humdrum realist, Rorty would have to abandon his replacement view that we should drop out of our vocabulary such words as “truth” and “objectivity” and take in instead “justification” and “solidarity”.

In a sense Michael Williams makes a similar objection, arguing that Rorty cannot have it both ways by being a skeptic and a pragmatist. Rorty’s antifoundationalism has, Williams argues, a lot in common with Hume’s skepticism and his dual stance about knowledge: on the one hand it is impossible, on the other hand we have to put aside our skepticism if we want to live in the world. Skepticism is what Rorty calls “irony”. Although it is not skepticism of the Cartesian kind, it is actually very close, Williams argues, to the familiar Agrippan skepticism: either dogmatism, or vicious circularity, or regress. The figure of regress, in Rorty’s hands, is the regress of vocabularies: there is no final one. But according to Williams there is a tension between this kind of skepticism and Rorty’s commitment to pragmatism and to liberalism, as well as between it and Rorty’s acceptance of Davidson’s response to skepticism (most of our beliefs could not be false). Williams is right, but the problem does not lie simply in Rorty’s kind of skepticism, but in his kind of pragmatism. Let us grant to Rorty that Peirce’s pragmatism and the theory that truth is the final, although hypothetical, goal of inquiry, is not the kind of view which harmonises best with his own brand of pragmatism. Rorty tells us that it is not truth, but warranted assertibility, which is the goal of inquiry, and in this he claims that he follows Dewey. But it is not evident that Deweyan pragmatism would have to renounce truth as a goal of inquiry, nor that fallibilism has to be understood as the view that our vocabularies are contingent, as is, for instance, witnessed by the existence of other forms of Deweyan pragmatism which do not shun truth as an aim, and construe fallibilism as the need to revise our beliefs, such as Isaac Levi’s version of this doctrine4 .

Joseph Rouse gives a sympathetic account of Rorty’s arguments against scientific realism and of his attempt to replace truth by solidarity. The ambiguity of Rorty’s stance on truth shows up here too. Rouse quotes a passage from Rorty where tells us that we should praise scientific institutions because they flesh out the idea of a “’free and open encounter’ … the sort of encounter in which truth cannot fail to win. But Rorty immediately adds, as if he had made a lapse: “To say that truth will win in such an encounter is not to make a metaphysical claim about the connection between human reason and the nature of things. It is merely to say that the best way to find out what to believe is to listen to as many suggestions and arguments as you can” (Objectivity, Relativity and Truth, p. 39). As Rouse notes, “Rorty does not want to differentiate his commitment to science from his larger commitment to the liberal democratic culture alongside which the sciences have primarily developed”. But it is not obvious that science developed in a primarily democratic culture. Robert Merton’s famous inquiries about the birth of modern science in the XVIIth century show on the contrary that it arose within a very puritan context, in which scientists thought that they had a duty to seek truth, and not at all within a sloppy democratic context where everyone “converses”. Rouse also objects that Rorty has in some sense retained part of the representationalist picture in conceiving science as a fabric of sentences and solidarity as the product of linguistic interchange. Rouse points out that science is better conceived as a set of material interactions, through the use of instruments and practices. The point is that we cannot disentangle human involvement in social solidarity and material practice, and that Rorty’s pragmatism needs to consider a larger pattern than that of sentences, formed by a background of practices, which are presumably not subject to discussion: it’s not easy to talk to a microscope. But it is also quite hard to see how material practices and instruments can make for democracy. And this will not allow us to answer the questions raised by epistemological behaviorism.

The next three papers deal with Rortian politics. Georgia Warnke analyses, and for the most part approves, Rorty’s appeal to Gadamerian hermeneutics in this field. We should not consider ourselves as transcending our historical situation, and we should consider our attempt at “achieving our country” as a form of self-understanding in the conversational form. Warnke, however, finds this “implausibly self referential”. She points out that we should also reject some interpretations of our past instead of taking them on board. Richard Bernstein also agrees for the most part with Rorty’s “inspirational liberalism”. He finds it, however, a little bit too abstract, and that it does not tell us what to do. Dewey had a concrete program for reform. The most critical, and brilliantly polemical, essay is the one by Jean Bethke Elshtain’s, entitled “Don’t be cruel: Reflections on Rortyan liberalism”. The essay is not written from the point of view of the analytic philosopher. On the contrary, Elshtain too regrets that Rorty is still too much of analytic philosopher, and prisoner of the choice between irony and representation. She accuses Rorty the ironist of frivolity and of verbalism. She points out that Rorty should pay more attention to details of history. The essay closes with an apology for truth (under the invocation of Vaclav Havel’s Living the Truth). The truth in question is, presumably, the truth which we experience and which emerges from our human condition, or the value of truth as sincerity, not the Objective Transcendent Truth which Rorty despises, and which I am not sure that Bethke Elshtain subscribes to. But she raises an important question, which is also raised by Bernard Williams in his last book, Truth and Truthfulness: what will become of the usual virtues of truth – sincerity, authenticity and the like – in a post-Rortian world (a world where our rationalistic vocabulary will have gone away)?

The book closes with an essay by Charles Taylor, who reinstates and furthers, for the most part, his previous dialogue with Rorty. Like many critics, he objects that Rorty has not completely succeeded in freeing himself from the illusions of representationalism. Taylor finds a place both for humdrum or “ordinary everyday inescapable realism”, and for a scheme/ content distinction. He points out, most rightly in my view, that there is no reason to think we are less free if we accept certain truths (for instance that 2+2 = 4). This of course reminds us of Orwell’s famous “freedom is the freedom to say that 2+2= 4”, and Rorty has a famous reply to this in his clever, but unconvincing, account of 1984: it’s not truth or reality that matter here, but cruelty, or torture: it’s wrong to get any proposition whatsoever from someone through torture. But it is hard to think that we could reject any of these methods without mentioning truth. Rorty’s predicament here seems to me to be close to Foucault’s: how can one justify objections to a form of illegitimate power if one agrees that there is no other justification of power than power itself? If at no point truth is mentioned, justification goes away.

In a sense, these essays allow us to escape the usual boring dialectic: on the one hand any reply to Rorty to the effect that it is not so easy to get rid of truth, reason, etc. will attract the counter-reply that one is still trapped by the hopeless distinctions of realism and anti-realism, scheme and content, etc.; on the other hand if one counterreplies to that that one does not see why the distinctions are hopeless, we are still stuck. Many of these essays, on the contrary, find Rorty himself trapped in the very distinctions that he denounces. They seem, however, often to be plus royalistes que le roi, by agreeing with Rorty that these distinctions are indeed suspect. The best of these essays raise the interesting question: why should we accuse the usual suspects? None of these essays, however, really addresses the issue of what would happen in our post-Rortian age, after the demise of truth, representation, realism, etc.

No catastrophe, Rorty tells us, once these are gone. Right. But in my view, that’s because they would still be there.


1. Alan Sokal and Jean Bricmont, Intellectual Impostures, Profile Books, London.

2. Name dropping and overattribution to a writer are familiar Rortian ploys. Unfortunately the editors fall into the latter when they attribute to him (p. 32) Davidson’s famous view that “nothing can justify a belief except a belief”.

3. See for instance C.Wright, Truth and objectivity, Oxford: Oxford University Press, and P. Engel, Truth, Chesham: Acumen 2002.

4. See in particular Isaac Levi, The Covenant of Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1997. Levi’s pragmatist rationalism gives ample evidence that one can be a Deweyan without renouncing the standards of truth and reason.