Richard Rufus of Cornwall. In Physicam Aristotelis. Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi XVI

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Rega Wood (ed.), Richard Rufus of Cornwall. In Physicam Aristotelis. Auctores Britannici Medii Aevi XVI, Oxford, 2004. 250pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0197262740.

Reviewed by Edith Sylla, North Carolina State University


This volume contains a Latin edition, from the single manuscript Erfurt Universitätsbibliothek, Codex Ampl. Q. 312, ff. 1ra –14ra, of what its editor, Rega Wood, argues is a commentary on Aristotle’s Physics based on lectures by Richard Rufus of Cornwall at Paris before 1238, thus making it, in her opinion, a record of “the earliest known surviving Western lectures” on Aristotle’s Physics (p. 2). Amplonius de Bercka, the Renaissance bibliophile who collected many of the medieval manuscripts now found at Erfurt, including Q 312, had described this work as “notule Burley super libris phisicorum” (p. 34). Walter Burley, however, composed no Aristotle commentaries before the very late thirteenth or early fourteenth century, whereas MS Q 312 has been dated by Richard Rouse, on paleographical grounds, as “on the early side of the middle of the [thirteenth] century” (p. 33), thus making Burley’s authorship temporally impossible. In recent decades, Rega Wood has devoted herself to a campaign to attribute the authorship of this work, and of other related works, to Richard Rufus of Cornwall, an author who, before Wood’s work, was unknown to or neglected by historians of thirteenth-century natural philosophy. Moreover, on the basis of these attributions, she proposes to rewrite the history of Aristotelian natural philosophy at Paris in the early thirteenth century, considerably moving up the date at which lectures on Aristotle’s physical works were first given to not long after 1231.

When she eventually comes in her Introduction to this book to the question of “attribution and date” of the work, Wood is, perhaps understandably, a bit testy:

If the Physics commentary should prove to be by an author other than Richard Rufus, that would be an amazing coincidence. It would require that there was another author who held a series of unusual views on a variety of subjects just like Rufus’, that his name was Richard, and that he wrote at the same time as Richard Rufus…. a coincidence of the sort that would account for two Richards active in the 1230’s, holding the same views, is not the sort of possibility we should expect to have to exclude in establishing medieval attributions; to require that would exceed the degree of certainty appropriate to the discipline (p. 74).

Salva reverentia sua, I would say that hesitation is still possible. It would be one thing if Wood wanted only to attribute this Physics commentary to Richard Rufus of Cornwall. It is something else, however, when she wants, at the same time, to revise significantly the chronology of thirteenth-century Aristotelianism. Although Wood has compiled a number of arguments in favor of Richard Rufus of Cornwall’s authorship of this Physics commentary, the degree of certainty she achieves falls short of what the scholarly community has a right to demand before rewriting textbooks to take the laurels for priority or preeminence in Western commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics away from, say, Robert Grosseteste and to award them instead to Richard Rufus of Cornwall. Moreover, Wood’s identifications of what she calls “a series of unusual views on a variety of subjects” are not all equally convincing. As we have all experienced, historians have a marked tendency to become advocates for the particular objects of their study and to ascribe relatively more credit to a person to whom they have devoted years of their study and less to that person’s competitors. Wood’s championing of Richard Rufus may appear to fall into this category. On other hand, no one has proved that Wood’s claims are false. It will be exciting to see whether she is in the end vindicated and whether we have to acknowledge that teaching of Aristotle’s physical works began at Paris as early as the mid-1230s.

But before commenting further on this issue, let me first acknowlege the incontestable merits of this book. Before anyone can establish, with as much certainty as the subject allows, the chronology and significance of the reception of Aristotle’s Physics in medieval Europe, we need convenient access to well-edited texts. There are difficulties that beset any editor who tries to publish a modern edition of a medieval text that exists in only one known exemplar, as Wood herself notes (p. 75). Luckily for Wood, MS Q 312 is a relatively good manuscript; her paleographical skills are excellent; and she has enlisted the collaboration of a number of other scholars in revising the text. As she notes, there are not a few instances where the abbreviations used in Q 312 are so cryptic or ambiguous that several alternative readings are plausible (see pp. 80–81). In such cases, there is little recourse except to supply the expansion of the word based on the sense of the argument. On the other hand, when the sense of the argument depends on the choice of the expansion, it may be necessary to indicate that alternative readings are possible. A case in point occurs in Book IV, f. 8va, where the author is arguing that time, as the number of motion, can exist in the physical world even if there is no mind doing the numbering, counting, for instance, the hours and days. In Latin, a relevant distinction is between the numerus numerans and the numerus numeratus. If the same abbreviation, nus seems to be used for both numerans and numerus, how can it be decided which is meant? Wood handles this case by choosing to read the text:

Et sic sequitur: Si numerus est, numerans est. Sed hic numerans non est anima sed forma ipsorum numeratorum, sicut forma lapidis sic replicans se in aliqua supposita determinat eis aliquam certam discretionem et numerat ipsam.

In the apparatus, Wood notes concerning the second “numerans” in the first line of this text: “numerans vel forsan: numerus (nu’s).” Cecelia Trifogli in the work cited in the next paragraph handles the same problematic passage by writing: “Sed hic numerus (forte pro: sic numerans) non est anima.” Here the most plausible interpretation is that the manuscript wrongly has the abbreviation for “numerus,” but that the reading demanded by the sense is “numerans.”

Pages 85–244 of this book are taken up with the edition of the text and with the accompanying variants (few, given that there is a single manuscript) and editorial notes providing, for instance, related readings in other works, especially those ascribed to Rufus by Wood or others. The text almost always makes good sense, which gives the reader reason to believe that the manuscript has been correctly interpreted. Comparing Wood’s readings to those by Cecilia Trifogli in Oxford Physics in the Thirteenth Century (ca. 1250–1270) (Brill 2000), I find that the readings themselves are almost always, although not invariably, the same (the most common differences involve grammatical gender or case: where, for instance, Wood reads the last word of the above quoted text as “ipsam” agreeing with “discretionem,” Trifogli has “ipsa” agreeing with “supposita”), but that the punctuation is quite different: where Wood breaks up the text into many short sentences, Trifogli often has one long sentence. Sometimes, Trifogli’s punctuation seems to make better sense. Where, for instance, Wood punctuates (p. 181), “Propterea corpora duo, cum undique sint dimensionata, simpliciter necesse est ipsa distare,” Trifogli (p. 247) places a comma not after “dimensionata,” but after “simpliciter.” But these are minor points, and historians of medieval natural philosophy must be grateful to Wood for her expert edition of this text whether or not it proves to be the very earliest such text and whether or not Wood’s attribution of the text to Richard Rufus of Cornwall holds up over time.

For Wood’s claim that this is the earliest such text, the attribution to Richard Rufus is essential, because it is the presumed date of his entry into the Franciscan order, combined with the argument that he must have given the relevant lectures before becoming a Franciscan, that provides Wood with a terminus ante quem for the work of 1238. Since the work is anonymous in Q 312, aside from the rejected attribution to Walter Burley, identification of the author as Richard Rufus of Cornwall requires comparison of the content of the work with the content of other works known to be by Richard Rufus of Cornwall. Here a difficulty arises in compiling the list of works that can be ascribed to Richard Rufus of Cornwall with certainty. Two other historians have recently written book length works on Richard Rufus of Cornwall, namely Peter Raedts, Richard Rufus of Cornwall and the Tradition of Oxford Theology (Oxford 1987—based on a 1984 thesis in the Faculty of Modern History at Oxford) and Timothy Noone, “An edition and Study of the Scriptum super Metaphysicam, bk. 12, dist. 2: A Work Attributed to Richard Rufus of Cornwall” (Ph.D. dissertation, University of Toronto, 1987). Peter Raedts begins with the argument that Richard Rufus was the author of a commentary on the Sentences found in Oxford, Balliol College, MS 62. Earlier historians such as F. Pelster had concluded that the commentary, written between 1245 and 1250 by a Franciscan at Oxford, was most likely by Richard Rufus of Cornwall, and Raedts agrees. That the quires in the manuscript are referred to as pecia is used by Raedts as evidence that the manuscript is an apograph, a stationer’s exemplar, or most likely a manuscript used within the confines of the Franciscan convent in Oxford (pp. 21–23). The work often argues against Robert Grosseteste and Richard Fishacre. An odd feature of the manuscript is that numerous passages are marked for deletion, without actually being deleted, with the word va --- cat.

There is precious evidence for Richard Rufus’s work on the Sentences in Roger Bacon’s Compendium Studii Theologiae, which strongly criticizes Richard Rufus by name:

And I knew well the worst and most foolish [author] of these errors, who was called Richard of Cornwall, a very famous one among the foolish multitude. But to those who knew, he was insane and [had been] reproved at Paris for the errors which he had invented [and] promulgated when lecturing solemnly on the Sentences there, after he had lectured on the Sentences at Oxford from the year of the Lord 1250. From that [year of] 1250 up till now the multitude has remained in the errors of this master, i.e. for forty years and more, and it is currently gaining strength at Oxford, just where this unlimited madness began (Thomas Maloney, ed. and trans. Roger Bacon, Compendium of the Study of Theology, Leiden 1988, p. 87.)

Given that the MS Balliol 62 Sentences commentary must have been written in the period 1245–50, as determined by its reference to datable historical events, Raedts argues (p. 31) that the Latin of Bacon text should be interpreted as saying that Richard lectured at Paris from 1250, having lectured at Oxford earlier—in the translation this can be accomplished simply by putting a comma after “Oxford.” The doctrines that Bacon condemns in his Compendium can be found in the commentary in MS Balliol 62 in relation to the question whether Christ can be called a man in the days between his death and Resurrection (p. 32), but they are generally held by most thinkers other than Bacon, so the mere identity of views cannot be used to prove that the Balliol 62 commentary is by Richard of Cornwall (p. 34).

Nevertheless, having established to his own satisfaction that Richard Rufus of Cornwall was the author of the commentary on the Sentences in MS Balliol 62, Raedts finds it likely that Richard Rufus of Cornwall was also the author of various disputed questions ascribed to him, but he rejects the ascription of a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics ascribed to a Master Richard, and found in several manuscripts, particularly MS Vatican lat. 4538 and Erfurt Q 290, on the gounds that the views it expresses are quoted but rejected by Richard Rufus’s Oxford Sentences commentary. (Gedeon Gal in several articles had changed his mind about the possibility that the author of this Metaphysics commentary was Richard Rufus of Cornwall, allowing in the later articles that the ascription to Richard Rufus was possible.) Raedts gives as an example the discussion of whether God knows things outside himself and whether, if so, this does not cause multiplicity in God. In the Sentences commentary, the author ascribes the views of the Metaphysics commentary to “philosophi,” and he says, for instance:

Dicunt isti philosophi… quod hec propositio est impossibilis: una intellectione intelligit aliud et aliud. Hec tamen vera: una intellectione intelligit hominem et asinum. Quod non satis intelligo. Nam alia est ratio hominis et alia asini in mente divina…. Dicam ergo, ut videtur contra philosophos, quod cum Deus ratione alia et alia, idea alia et alia hominem condidit et asinum, et alia et alia ratione et idea hominem intelligit et asinum et tunc si alia specie et alia intelligit hoc et illud, aliud et aliud intelligit…. Nescio ergo quid intelligunt, cum dicunt una et eadem intellectione. Nam ratio sive idea alia et alia est, et obiecta alia et alia sunt inter se et ab ipso intelligente. Nescio ergo quomodo non aliud a se intelligat et alia inter se (pp. 101–02).

Raedts concludes, “Even if we allow for development of thought, it is impossible that the same man who wrote the commentary on the Metaphysics should have to admit a few years later that he does not understand his own thoughts any more. They must be two different authors” (pp. 102–03).

Timothy Noone, however, whose Ph.D. thesis concerns this very same Metaphysics commentary, calls it “ascribed to Richard Rufus of Cornwall.” Moreover, in an article published after his dissertation, Noone reports that, using ultraviolet light, Leonard Boyle read the incipit of the Metaphysics commentary (f. 1ra of MS Vat. lat. 4538) as saying ’Hic incipit metaphysica magistri Richardi Rufi de Cornub.” (T. Noone, “Richard Rufus of Cornwall and the authorship of the Scriptum super Metaphysicam,” Franciscan Studies 49 (1989), p. 68; I have not seen Noone’s Ph.D. dissertation where this same information may appear). Against the arguments of Raedts, Wood claims it is not surprising that, after becoming a Franciscan, Rufus should reject some of his earlier views (Rega Wood, “Richard Rufus of Cornwall on Creation: The Reception of Aristotelian Physics in the West,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 2 (1992): 4). She uses the passage quoted above and others like it mainly as evidence that Rufus wrote his Metaphysics commentary before joining the Franciscan order.

Noone, however, after arguing that the Metaphysics commentary is by Rufus, goes on to argue that it was probably written at Oxford after, and not before, Rufus entered the Franciscan order (Noone, “Richard Rufus,” Franciscan Studies 49 (1989): 78–83). Furthermore, Noone questions whether the commentary on the Sentences found in Oxford, Balliol MS 62, is actually by Rufus, rejecting Raedts’ reinterpretation of the dates in Bacon, which had allowed Rufus’ Oxford Sentences commentary to be dated before 1250. Wood accepts the ascription of both the Oxford Sentences commentary and the Metaphysics commentary to Rufus, but rejects the Oxford location of the latter.

In establishing her list of Rufus’authentic works, therefore, and of the dates and places in which they were composed,Wood is compelled to disagree with parts of the opinions of both Raedts and Noone, both otherwise generally credible authors. Her attempts to show, therefore, on the basis of works reliably ascribed to Richard Rufus of Cornwall that he held “unusual” views and that these views are found also in the Physics commentary in Erfurt Q 312, are on a somewhat precarious foundation. In arguing against Noone’s view that the profound influence of Grosseteste on the Rufus’ Metaphysics commentary is evidence that the work was produced at Oxford, Wood writes:

The scope of Grosseteste’s immediate influence is an open question, one which cannot be settled until we know more about the works written between 1235 and 1250. Before we have a reasonably complete picture of intellectual life in Paris before 1250, the presence or absence of his influence cannot be an argument for or against the claim that a work was written at Paris (Rega Wood, “Richard Rufus: Physics at Paris before 1240,” Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale 5 (1994): 91).

Something similar could be said about Wood’s efforts to identify unusual views held by Rufus—such views cannot be identified until we have a more complete picture of intellectual life in the period 1230–50. The areas where Wood attempts to discover such unusual views include the first cause, substantial change, the role of matter in individuation, inseparable accidents, instantaneous change, the beginning of the world, and heaven’s place as its outermost surface. I do not have space to evaluate her arguments here (and many were first made in previous articles, to which the reader should go for further details), but the general point remains that we need many more editions of texts such as the one found here before we can really determine which views were original and which views were common at any given time, let alone which opinions were strongly associated with a given author. Wood says, for instance, “Holding that heaven’s place was the farthest surface of the outermost sphere …was also not a position unique to Rufus. Since, however, his Physics lectures apparently introduced it in the West, we should not be surprised to find it echoed in his theology lectures”(p. 71). Albert the Great, however, ascribes the opinion that the place of the heavens is the convex surface (i.e. the outermost surface) to Gilbert Porretanus.The view, held previously by Avicenna, probably originates in the twelfth century, and early English commentators regard it as a traditional opinion (opinio communis) (Trifogli, p. 197). If this is the case, it seems a stretch for Wood to use this opinion as a means of linking Rufus’s commentary on the Sentences to the Physics commentary in Erfurt Q 312. Similar objections could be raised in other cases.

But back to the main point: this is a fine edition of a work which will be of interest and use to many historians of medieval natural philosophy. In a sense, Cecilia Trifogli’s overview of commentaries on the Physics from the mid-thirteenth century does more to establish the interest of the work than does Wood’s attempt to build a revolution in medieval natural philosophy around it. Accepting Wood’s ascription of the commentary to Richard Rufus of Cornwall and its dating ca. 1235, Trifogli endorses its early date, but associates this with an earlier stage in the reception of Aristotle:

Even apart from chronological considerations, it is clear that Rufus’questions on the Physics do not belong to our tradition but to an earlier stage. A comparative analysis shows that the structure of Rufus’ questions is much more “archaic” than that of our commentaries. Indeed, Rufus’questions are very short and have a barely articulated structure. Furthermore, many of them are “exegetical”, in the sense that they arise from some specific claim by Aristotle and tend simply to remove an immediate obstacle to its understanding. In effect, they look like glosses to Aristotle’s text. Consequently, the philosophical content of Rufus’questions is comparatively scanty (p. 31).

Nevertheless, there are aspects in common between Rufus’s commentary and those of the several anonymous and named authors Trifogli studies. Aside from opinions about the nature of place, her commentators agree with Rufus about time:

a version of Rufus’solution to the problem of the unity of time is quoted and accepted by a number of our commentators. As to the doctrine, Rufus, like our commentators, supports the extra-mental reality of time against Averroes’ contrary view that time depends on the soul. Furthermore, some of the origins of our commentators’ debate on the actual infinity in numbers can be found in Rufus. Finally, G1 and M3 [two commentaries studied by Trifogli] show first-hand knowledge of Rufus’ commentary. Indeed, in both these commentaries there is a high number of passages that appear almost verbatim in Rufus’questions (p. 32).

Similar ideas, in more mature and expanded form, are found in Roger Bacon’s questions on the Physics, according to Trifogli, so that there was a “significant continuity between the earlier commentaries by Rufus and Bacon, on the one hand, and our commentaries, on the other”(pp. 32–33). In later sections of her book, Trifogli is able to clarify the ideas of her several commentators by showing their origins in passages of Rufus’s work.

When Trifogli and others have edited other thirteenth-century Physics commentaries, more analysis on this order will be possible. I conclude, therefore, that this book is a significant contribution to research, that Wood has not proven absolutely her more extravagant claims for Rufus, but neither has anyone definitively disproved those claims. Wood just might be right, and it will be worthwhile pursuing the lines of research she has opened.