Ricoeur and Lacan

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Karl Simms, Ricoeur and Lacan, Continuum, 2007, 161pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826477965.

Reviewed by David Pellauer, DePaul University


The immediate focus of this book is evident from its title. The questions considered and the way they are arranged and addressed is less clear, and I have to say that at the end one may want to question what holds them together. The word "comparison" appears in the first sentence as a possible answer, but there are still questions that can be asked regarding what is being compared, to what end, and how this is to be done. A first answer to these questions comes on the following page where we are told that the author wishes to mediate between Ricoeur and Lacan but in "doing so is automatically placed on the side of Ricoeur" (2), so one might think the point is to show Ricoeur's superiority (in some respect) to Lacan. Still, Simms also says he wants to show that there are some real points of similarity between them, even if in the end they are irreconcilable, so one will read on perhaps wondering which way the balance will tip. The first of these points of contact we are told has to do with how both thinkers stand in relation to Descartes and more particularly to the Cartesian cogito, which each questions, but in different ways. The second point of contact has to do with their attitudes toward Freud, although here the gap between them is greater: Simms shows Ricoeur was never able to accept what he called Freud's realism while Lacan could and did, albeit in his own way. A sidelight here is Simms' effort to show that over time Ricoeur came less and less to emphasize this understanding of Freud, to the point even of arguing that Freud himself was not the victim of any vicious kind of naïve realism. For Ricoeur, Simms concludes, the unconscious finally remains relative to conscious awareness, albeit to that of another. This is unlike Lacan who always held that Freud had shown that there was such a thing as an independently existing unconscious, and that it not only existed independently of consciousness but could even be said to think.

Simms' third point of comparison between Ricoeur and Lacan is their interpretations of Hegel's master-slave dialectic. For Lacan, "the mutual recognition of the master-slave dialectic is what originates desire as desire for another" (6); for Ricoeur, it has more to do with the birth of the self. It is this way of seeing things that helps Ricoeur argue that both phenomenology and psychoanalysis should be understood as forms of hermeneutics that themselves stand in a dialectical relationship, psychoanalysis serving as something like an archeology of the subject, phenomenology rather tending in the direction of a teleology of selfhood, a new understanding that incorporates the unconscious into an enlarged self-understanding. In a word, then, one organizing structure of this book is to show that Lacan and Ricoeur take up similar themes but they reach quite different conclusions.

Those familiar with either Ricoeur's or Lacan's work will likely already know that there was once a lively, to put it mildly, encounter between them, that went well beyond this listing of differing ideas, even if it was largely carried out through intermediaries on Lacan's side. They accused Ricoeur not only of misunderstanding Lacan but, somehow at the same time, of stealing his ideas. Ricoeur, for his part, responded that he never really understood what Lacan was saying or claimed to do so, and, in fact, in what he wrote, he (Ricoeur) was only interested in Freud, not Lacan. Simms acknowledges this French brouhaha in passing, but what he has to say about it is not central to his discussion of the topics listed above, nor does he add any new historical data about it beyond what is already available in existing secondary accounts. The one lesson Simms does draw from bringing it up is that it helps us to see another point of comparison and contention between Ricoeur and Lacan, namely, how they understand the unconscious in relation to language. As it turns out, they again come at this question from opposite directions. This is one reason why Lacan, Simms suggests, could not see what Ricoeur was saying about the ability of language to produce new meanings (and by implication, new self-understanding) in contrast to his own more limited idea of the symbolic and what it finally reveals.

Simms, finally, compares how Ricoeur and Lacan take up and interpret Kant's ethics, particularly its formulations of the categorical imperative. For Simms, what is at issue here is not so much what Ricoeur and Lacan have to say about the possible continuity or discontinuity between the different formulations of the categorical imperative, although he does acknowledge there are important differences worth noting. No, what really is at issue in his discussion of this topic is presented through a shift of focus from Lacan to his interpreter Žižek. The question at issue it turns out is whether a non-pathological desire is possible, where this would be one of the requirements for an ethics that can include desire. The guiding assumption is, in other words, that a deontological desire must be a non-pathological one. But this will require something like a sacrifice, or at least a giving up of pathological forms of desire, something Lacan thought to be impossible. It is something, however, that Ricoeur allows for, even while admitting that it is always difficult. Simms cites Ricoeur’s discussions of our ability to make and keep promises and of our solicitude for others as evidence of this possibility. This is why Ricoeur wins out over Lacan for Simms in the end.

The introductory chapter lays out this framework for the book and even announces where it will lead. What follows is meant to fill in the details. I am not sure that these chapters add up to a continuous argument, so must ask whether, in the end, Simms has made his case or simply stated a preference between the two thinkers. Chapter 2 begins the argument by taking up the question of Ricoeur's and Lacan's different critiques of the Cartesian cogito. As Simms shows, Lacan's perspective amounts to reading Descartes as though he were an existentialist, but an existentialist who in light of Freud can be shown to conceive of the subject as an "I" with an unconscious, yet where this unconscious makes the I something other than it can ever think itself to be. Ricoeur, on the other hand, wants to put the emphasis more on an embodied I who exists in the world with others, which in his later work he takes up as the question of a responsible self not reducible to the subject of the Cartesian subject-object relation. As Ricoeur acknowledges this still leaves room for the question of the unconscious in his account of what it means to be a self. For Simms, it is specifically the idea of desire and how it relates to this unconscious that establishes the possible connecting point here between what Lacan and Ricoeur have to say about this unconscious, however much they may differ about it in the end. Simms presents this comparison in his third chapter. In the next chapter he adds the topic of language and how it plays a role in this discussion for both Ricoeur and Lacan. Here the differences between them become all the sharper since Ricoeur sees language as a possible guide to the unconscious, while Lacan, as is well-known, held that "the unconscious is structured like a language." Simms's claim is that Ricoeur has the better understanding of language here, one founded on a better reading of Saussure as the founder of a structural linguistics as it leads to the theory of language both he and Lacan draw on. Simms make this point through a long discussion of Lyotard's critique of Lacan's reading of Saussure and what Simms himself acknowledges to be a detour by way of Roman Jacobson on the nature of metaphor. So far as I can see, this latter move is there largely only because it allows a return to Ricoeur, who criticized Jacobson's theory of metaphor in his own work on this topic. This discussion of language and its figurative aspects, Simms concludes at the end of chapter 4, turns out to be a basis from which to "question Lacan's theory of desire and demand, insofar as it is based on a Jacobsoninan model."

The gist of this critique comes in chapter 5, which also brings in the ethical dimension mentioned in the Introduction through a comparison to Kant. It involves a long discussion of Lacan on the idea of a symbol followed by a discussion of Ricoeur’s and Lacan's picking up a reference to Hegel's master-slave dialectic. This latter discussion is an important step in the unfolding of Simms's case in that it allows him to bring in the question of recognition in relation to such topics as desire, narcissism, and misrecognition. These are taken as finally pointing to the question of a possible ethics from Lacan's and Ricoeur's points of view. The idea of the symbol and a symbolic order plays the key role here. For Lacan, this is a closed order, for Ricoeur it is an open one, hence not an obstacle to new meaning, or even to its own understanding. This is why Ricoeur can hold, against Lacan, that "psychoanalysis does not have a monopolistic propriety" over symbols. Simms adds another conclusion, again pointing in the direction of Žižek and his followers, that Lacan in fact is "equally dismissive of both Kantian and Sadean ethics." Lacan's own position is really a return to a pre-Kantian ethics of sentiment, albeit one that does not ever really present an account of the moral sentiments because of the limitations psychoanalysis imposes, owing to its being a mode of analysis, not of synthesis. This leaves us, Simms says, with two possibilities, either to work out the missing Lacanian ethics or to go in another direction, something like a post-Freudian Kantian ethics. Not surprisingly, the latter is what he sees may be possible by returning to Ricoeur.

Chapter 7 is a presentation of Ricoeur's ethics with a strong emphasis on the Kantian aspect of what Ricoeur himself called his post-Hegelian Kantianism. A key point here that ties this discussion back to Lacan and Freud is the question of death. For Ricoeur the idea that there is a basic choice to be made between freedom or death is a false one. It is not so much a question of what one is to do, as of how does one lead a good life. For those who know Ricoeur's work, the answer is, of course, with and for others in just institutions. Here is where a notion of responsibility that goes beyond Freud comes into play, one marked by generosity, the gift of mutual recognition, and what Ricoeur sometimes calls a logic of superabundance.

Although it is clear by now that Simms favors Ricoeur over Lacan, he does add a chapter on the possibility of ethics after Lacan that is really another discussion of Žižek, since "Lacan himself did not develop these ideas" (121). Simms' judgment here is harsh. Žižek is more interested in a political than an ethical economy. This comes down to a nostalgia for the authority of a symbolic order that finally fails to answer the question what is to be done, and therefore does not answer the question of responsibility, the "great unsaid of his work" (133). Weakening his original preference for Ricoeur somewhat, Simms goes on to say that "it is this absence that leads us, if not to prefer Ricoeur over Žižek, then at least to supplement the latter by the former" (ibid.) by taking up his demand for solicitude for the other and a mutual reciprocity grounded in faith rather than in skepticism. This leads to a brief concluding chapter that reiterates Simms' preference for Ricoeur, ending with the suggestion that something like Ricoeur's call for what Gabriel Marcel called disponibilité is in fact called for by psychoanalysis itself. If this is the case, then it also follows that if "the subject's love of the Other is no longer pathological, but an instantiation of universal agape, then a new concept of desire is called for" (140), one that can properly be called a deontological desire that will make the subject's love of the Other possible.

As I have indicated, I think the argument to this conclusion could have been made more directly by setting the issue more clearly at the beginning and then relating it to Ricoeur's philosophical work. It might then have been possible even to do without any reference to Lacan. (However, I do think it could be worthwhile today to reexamine the dispute between them and its context in light of the passing of time and the fact that tempers have cooled down since their deaths.) But to stick to the question of an ethics that can incorporate the idea of desire, and even take seriously what psychoanalysts have said about desire, I think then more could have been said about the distinction Ricoeur makes in his later work on ethics between the near and the distant other. That we do not and cannot relate to them in the same way has to make a difference to any ethics that includes both the personal and the social dimensions. What is possible at the level of the near other, solicitude, is no longer possible in the case of the many others whom I will never meet or know face to face. As Ricoeur has suggested, here is where notions like equal respect and the just play a more central role. Perhaps Simms will continue to unfold his project of a reformed, psychoanalytically informed ethics in a future work in this direction.