Ricœur Across the Disciplines

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Scott Davidson (ed.), Ricœur Across the Disciplines, Continuum, 2010, 237pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826438461.

Reviewed by David Pellauer, DePaul University


One may wonder what a collection of essays bearing this title finally has to contribute to specifically philosophical inquiry. It may well be able to show that a philosopher, Ricœur, has had an influence on people working in different fields, or that his writings have influenced efforts in those disciplines, or even, more positively, that there may be something to learn from them that will help in making sense of or evaluating Ricœur's own efforts. In fact, one finds a bit of all three of these possibilities in this work, which means it will be read in different ways by different readers. The most obvious audience will be those concerned with Ricœur's work. People working in different fields may find one or two of the essays relevant to their particular research interests. In the end, though, what this volume shows best is how a philosopher's work can reach across all too often taken for granted disciplinary boundaries in suggestive or even provocative ways. Unfortunately, given the book's price it is more likely to be consulted piecemeal or read cover to cover only as a book taken from a library rather than to find a wide readership, even among dedicated Ricœur scholars. But that seems to be the fate of most essay collections these days. Like similarly priced monographs, perhaps such volumes will find a happier future in the online world, if a more reasonable pricing structure can be determined.

In his introduction, editor Scott Davidson proposes following a suggestion by the Italian philosopher Domenico Jervolino that Ricœur's work can be understood as a way of doing philosophy through language, where this approach is organized in terms of a three stage development that runs from symbols through texts to translation. Each of these stages "develops and expands the treatment of language contained in the preceding paradigm" (2). It is the final stage, translation, that most speaks to the question of the plurality of disciplines and "the task of the interdisciplinary scholar" (5) who serves two (or more) masters in facing the challenge of making two (or more) discourses communicate. Unfortunately, there is no contribution from translation studies to back up this assertion. Still, Davidson's claim is that the contributions in this book do "make a compelling case for the interdisciplinary scope and appeal of Ricœur's work" (10). The question must be to what extent the papers included go much beyond indicating that such an appeal exists. Some succeed better than others, as can be seen from a brief look at what is on offer.

Adriaan Peperzak discusses Ricœur and his work from three points of view. Ricœur was Peperzak's teacher and he presents a portrait of Ricœur as a beloved, effective teacher, concerned for students, someone who took his teaching seriously. Peperzak then moves on to Ricœur's own approach to philosophy, which he sees as congruent with Ricœur's approach to his teaching, i.e., careful, always well-prepared and aware of both the literature and the main issues, unwilling to simply follow the latest fad or reigning paradigm uncritically. These virtues carry over to Ricœur's written work, which is not revolutionary but is always insightful and fair to those he discusses, even when he takes his distance from them. Finally, Perperzak compares and contrasts Ricœur to his colleague Emmanuel Levinas, for whom Perperzak has an equal regard. The contrast between them comes down to the difference between Ricœur's patient, careful approach, always well-grounded in the sources, with Levinas's more "hyperbolic" and declarative approach which helps to fill out the picture Peperzak proposes of Ricœur's "style" as a philosopher. Those who knew Ricœur will surely recognize him in the portrait Peperzak presents of both the person and, given the space limits of an essay, in his overview of Ricœur's many books and articles.

Richard Kearney draws on an early Ricœur essay on religion, atheism, and faith to suggest that his own notion of "anatheism" is a good way to make sense of Ricœur's religious/theological concerns, particularly as a response to the question, what comes after God, the god of ontotheology? Kearney tracks this suggestion through Ricœur's idea of a hermeneutics of suspicion and his hermeneutic interpretation of faith in relation to our desire to exist, up to Ricœur's last works on translation and living up to death. A God who comes after God, Kearney concludes, is something to wager on in hope for a renewed, a refigured life.

William Schweiker represents the discipline of theology. He concedes that Ricœur never claimed to do theology, but only to seek the originary religious expression that lies behind it. Schweiker claims that Ricœur does, however, help theologians to renew the theological task on the basis of his hermeneutical approach. According to Schweiker, if we try to envision that theology we see that what Ricœur points to is not a dogmatic theology internal to a community that seeks to interpret its beliefs to itself nor is it apologetic in the sense that it is meant to convey a community's beliefs to an outside audience. Instead, Ricœur's work should be read as that of a mediating theologian whose theology arises from and tries to give meaning to our effort to exist. The core to this is an idea of reconciliation that makes possible the human project of living a good life with and for others in just institutions as well as supporting our ability to act in quest of this, both individually and publicly, in the social and political arenas.

François Dosse is a historian whose own work has focused on the history of developments in French historiography in the twentieth century. He also has written a major biography of Ricœur. In his essay he discusses the impact of Ricœur's book Memory, History, Forgetting on French historians. He does so by looking at how this work along with Ricœur's earlier reflections on history has provided ways for historians to rethink questions having to do with the status of historical knowledge. Beyond this, Dosse holds that Ricœur's work is valuable for historians in that it provides a basis for a critique of how awareness of our common historicity has led to an emphasis on commemorative acts in recent years. It also provides resources for addressing the increasing confusion about the status and role of experts, historians, and judges in the contemporary world. In a word, for historians Ricœur's work is valuable because it provides a basis for reopening questions having to do with the nature of the historiographical work that defines their profession.

George Taylor addresses the relation of Ricœur to the legal profession. His essay is, to my mind, the most important one in this volume because it is willing to offer a critique of Ricœur's hermeneutics that needs to be taken seriously. Ricœur's hermeneutical theory, Taylor shows, largely focuses on interpretation as a way to increased self-understanding, even when in his late essays Ricœur does address questions related to the law. But Taylor reminds us, "self-understanding is not the issue for a lawyer or a judge interpreting a legal text" (85). Furthermore, questions regarding the author of a legal text retain an important role in legal hermeneutics, one that tends to be overlooked by Ricœur's emphasis on the semantic autonomy of texts that outlive their authors and their initial audiences and situations. Finally, Taylor does underscore the importance of Ricœur's hermeneutical reflections on the importance of the application of meaning of the law as applied to particular circumstances. He thus sees Ricœur's work as finally offering helpful insights for theories of legal interpretation. One important factor here is the need to acknowledge that the role of the productive imagination in all imagination also is operative when it comes to the law.

Bernard Dauenhauer takes up Ricœur in relation to political theory, particularly in regard to the debate between liberalism and communitarianism. He argues that Ricœur's theory of the self and self-identity is important because it encompasses the strengths of both these positions without getting caught in their defects. As such it "has important implications for sound political practice in the complex world we now inhabit" (103). The following essay, by Andreea Deciu Ritivoi on Ricœur and rhetorical theory, complements Dauenhauer's contribution in that it seeks to show how Ricœur's reflections on the concept of recognition can contribute to discussions about the role of rhetoric in the public sphere. Ricœur's writings are valuable not only for helping us to rethink the nature of the public sphere but also for making sense of how ideas of collective identity and affiliation function there in relation to arguments and conflicts, where their resolution may lead to states of peace.

Pamela Sue Anderson addresses the value of Ricœur's work for women's studies, especially his idea of how human beings affirm themselves through their confidence in their ability to act. After having briefly reviewed what Ricœur has to say in this regard, she turns to the question of a possible feminist transformation or development of Ricœur's work that would build on the resources to be found in Spinoza's idea of conatus and what both thinkers have to say about love in relation to this idea.

Maria del Guadalupe Davidson and Scott Davidson take up the question of Ricœur in relation to African and African-American studies, particularly from the perspective of black feminist thought. Race was not a question directly addressed by Ricœur, so the approach has to be a more indirect one in this instance. Here again it is the idea of the capable human being which Ricœur develops that serves as a guideline. The Davidsons argue that black feminist thought has much to contribute here and much to learn. It has much to contribute in that black feminists have taken seriously the pathos of suffering, which Ricœur was never able fully to resolve. Black feminism "provides a rich and detailed portrait of the struggle to have a voice, to become an agent, to develop self-esteem" (165) that can enhance Ricœur's own investigations of the capable human being as both acting and suffering.

Peter Kemp takes up the importance of Ricœur for a philosophy of education. He shows that Ricœur's thought has already had an influence among European theorists. What Ricœur has to say about the relationship between teacher and student, the nature of today's university, and ethical formation is especially valuable. Kemp also discusses how Ricœur's own experiences as both professor and administrator have fed his thoughts on these topics.

Karl Simms's contribution addresses Ricœur and psychoanalysis. In this case, the paper is more focused on what Ricœur had to say about psychoanalysis, at least through his book on Freud, than on what psychoanalysis as a discipline might learn from Ricœur. In this sense, this chapter is a shorter version of what Simms has already addressed at greater length in his book on Ricœur and Lacan.

The final essay by Roger Savage is the most surprising and unexpected one, at least to my eye. It takes up Ricœur from the perspective of musicology, a discipline I would not have considered in thinking of Ricœur's possible influence. Savage discusses how Ricœur's hermeneutical approach can be used to criticize elements of a more formalist approach to music, which Savage suggests often amounts to deconstructing music by denying it any efficacy in relation to our lived experience or any ability to speak in ways that help refigure our inherence in the world. He further suggests that Ricœur's work on metaphor and the idea of a limit experience can be useful in making sense of this role for aesthetic experience.