Derrida/Searle: Deconstruction and Ordinary Language

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Raoul Moati, Derrida/Searle: Deconstruction and Ordinary Language, Timothy Attanucci and Maureen Chun (trs.), Columbia University Press, 2014, 138pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231166713.

Reviewed by Samuel C. Wheeler III, University of Connecticut


In the mid-1970s, something like a debate took place between Jacques Derrida and John Searle. Derrida had published an essay[1] that both appreciated and criticized J. L. Austin's How to Do Things with Words.[2] Searle wrote a reply,[3] which attributed to Derrida misunderstandings of basic elements of the philosophy of language. Derrida wrote a reply to Searle's reply,[4] which did not address Searle's view, and was derisive. Raoul Moati has written a dispassionate, careful, even-handed account of the sequence of essays and their significance.

The book consists of a foreword placing Moati's book in the context of the secondary literature on Derrida, an introduction, two substantial chapters, and a conclusion. The introduction sets the context, characterizes the literature about this debate, and sketches the outlines of the debate. Subsequent chapters are quite detailed discussions of background and issues.

Chapter 1 is a commentary on "Signature, Event, Context." This is an intricate chapter covering many topics. It opens with a discussion of "communication" and its apparent presupposition that there are meanings to be transported from one place to another. Derrida's discussion of "communication" illustrates his views about dissemination.

Derrida is interested in Austin's work because Austin appears to have an understanding of how language functions that does not invoke meanings as entities transmitted. Austin attempts to replace the model of meanings fitting reality to yield truth with another model that treats language as a variety of things we do. Very briefly, Derrida's critique is that Austin's account of speech acts requires appeal to the meanings he is attempting to avoid to supplement the conventions constituting speech actions.

The core of the chapter is a discussion of a number of topics explaining the notion of the iterative as the reverse side of the performative. That notion is that the possibility of repeating the same formula ("I pronounce you man and wife") in other circumstances, both felicitous and non-felicitous, is what makes a singular action of marrying possible. Derrida treats this potential for detachment of any utterance from the speaker's intention as a constitutive feature of writing, but argues that speech is actually in the same condition as writing. He develops a generalized notion of "writing" whose central feature is the repeatability (iterability) of any inscription in any system of signs. Thus, the utterance itself has no necessary connection with the intended meaning a speaker expresses by its means. Derrida's critique of Husserl is directed at the phenomenological version of the idea that a semantic intention could be especially connected to a speech event.

While Derrida criticizes Husserl's notion of presence, intentionality, and meaning, his conception of what meaning is remains, according to Moati,Husserlian. Moati argues that Derrida's critique of Austin errs in two main ways: First, Derrida operates with a phenomenological conception of intentionality that may not be appropriate to Austin's tradition. "Presence" is not a concept Austin or his tradition uses. Second, as Searle observes, Derrida treats illocutionary and perlocutionary force as essentially the same, assimilating them both to a Nietzschean conception of force. I discuss these claims below.

Chapter 2 is a discussion of Searle's response to Derrida's views. This chapter, like the previous one, covers many topics. The differences between Searle's conception of intentionality and Derrida's are explicated. I take Derrida's critique of Husserl to be an argument that there cannot be a medium of meaning that lacks the features of writing. In effect, this is an argument that writing is as direct an expression of meaning as there can be. If this is the case, then the distance between a meaning and its expression, which is most obvious in writing, is in fact a constitutive feature of all speech and thought. Searle does not realize that Derrida holds that everything he says about writing also applies to speech. Derrida argued[5] that the idea that our inner speech somehow directly connects a meaning with words is an illusion. The features of writing that he focuses on are in fact features also of speech.

Searle takes Derrida's discussion of iterability as the separation of a text from its origin to be a misunderstanding of permanence, that an intended meaning is preserved beyond the speaker's presence or even existence. As Moati makes clear, this is the core difference between them. Searle and Derrida agree that the intention of a speech act is not a separate, independently meaningful thought-notation that gets attached to a linguistic token. There is nothing "below" the linguistic. Husserl's conception, which Derrida takes to be the standard philosophical idea, separates meaning from signs. Derrida holds that, since linguistic items are all there is and they have no essential connection to any particular meaning, meaning is not completely present in a speech act. The possibility of alternative meaning is constitutive of being linguistic.

Searle's idea is to make the linguistic intention identical with the speech act, thus avoiding appeal to an intention that infuses the words. Searle's device to erase any gap between meaning and language is convention. Linguistic conventions supplement token-production to weld particular meanings to particular speech or writing events, which can then be preserved and transmitted. Conventions are both vertical and horizontal. That is, there have to be conventions not only for what kind of speech act is done, but also conventions which separate "serious" speech acts from, for instance, sentences uttered during a performance. Thus, Searle can treat iterability as the permanent attachment of intention to a speech act. So, for Searle, textual reproductions of speech acts retain their tie to intention, while, for Derrida, the possibility of reproductions means that the tie to conscious intention is always already broken.

Derrida's critique of Austin consists in part of noting that, in distinguishing "felicitous" from "non-felicitous" attempted speech acts, Austin had recourse to intentions. Derrida doubts that convention suffices to eliminate the need for a supplementary intention. Thus, for Derrida, the idea that there is nothing behind language making words meaningful has radical implications that it does not have for Searle. For instance, an actor on the stage who intends to alert the audience that there is actually a fire in the theatre has a difficulty if the performance makes it possible that "There is really a fire!" is a part of the performance.

The very brief conclusion argues that the debate, for all its mutual misunderstanding, illuminates intentionality as well as the notion of theperformative and its relation to convention.

Moati argues effectively that both participants treat their opponent unfairly and that each misunderstands the other. In reading this book, one goes back to the texts of Austin, Derrida, and Searle, because of the original thoughts Moati has about the two discussants. Moati is especially useful, at least for analytic philosophers, in relating Derrida's concerns to those of Searle, and connecting Derrida and Searle to their respective traditions. In contrast to most of the other literature on this debate, Moati takes care to treat both participants as skilled philosophers, albeit with some blind spots about their opponent. This is a good book with relevance beyond the debate itself.

Nonetheless, I have some reservations about Moati's treatment. First, Moati and Searle both criticize Derrida's assimilation of illocutionary and perlocutionary force. When we re-read Austin, however, we see that he himself has difficulty making the distinction. At the end of Lecture X, having spent two chapters distinguishing perlocution from illocution, Austin says, "The general conclusion must be, however, that these formulas are at best very slippery tests for deciding whether an expression is an illocution as distinct from a perlocution or neither."[6] Austin thinks there is a distinction, but one that cannot be drawn sharply. Derrida's attack on metaphysics takes metaphysics to be a would-be science. For metaphysical purposes, then, distinctions that cannot be made sharp are not legitimate distinctions at all. So, arguably, Derrida is justified in his terms in treating illocutionary and perlocutionary forces as essentially the same. Derrida's treatment of distinctions is central to his deconstructive arguments. That Austin does not consider himself to be doing metaphysics is, Derrida would say, not relevant. Derrida's critique, arguing that Austin uses self-interpreting intentions, is intended to show that Austin is in fact committed to logoi, the thought-words of the metaphysics of presence that Derrida finds in his discussions of historical figures from Plato on.

A second, related point is that Moati sometimes seems to be excessively historicist on the topic of whether Derrida and Searle are talking about the same thing in their views of intentionality. It is certainly true that Derrida's conception of the intentional is rooted in Husserl and "presence." It is also true that Searle's conception of intentionality is thoroughly imbedded in Austin's "ordinary language," speech-act philosophy. A theme of Derrida's work is that philosophy has always had a conception of meaning that rests on a pure presence of meaning. Derrida holds that there is a commonality across philosophical writings and traditions, so that Condillac, in a sense, is a Platonist. He is interested in Austin partly because Austin tries to break out of the idea that there are these logoi and to understand language in other terms. Austin, he argues, still requires logoi that a speaker deploys in order to distinguish the speech acts that do what they are supposed to do from various ways in which they can fail.

A third observation is that Moati often describes philosophical views without evaluating or defending them. On some topics there are obvious problems to be dealt with. For instance, Searle's idea that horizontal conventions will solve difficulties about whether a speech act is serious needs more defense. Whatever the conventions that determine that something is a play, an actor could say "There is a fire backstage," meaning that there really is. He is in a difficult spot, but his speech act must at least possibly be taken seriously. It is hard to see how a conventional device can separate out the real from the pretend, since any such conventional sign can be part of the pretense.[7]

Moati likewise gives Derrida a pass when Derrida apparently[8] argues that "communicate," because it can be about semantic messages or doors between rooms, has no determinate meaning. A similar argument would show that "tall" means something different when applied to people and to buildings. He could have mentioned communicants who are qualified to participate in the Mass. This is not semantic drift or dissemination, on the surface.

[1] Derrida, Jacques, "Signature, Event, Context." First published in English in Glyph 1, Johns Hopkins University Press, 1977, pp. 172-197.

[2] Austin, J. L., How to Do Things with Words, Oxford University Press, 1962.

[3] Searle, John, "Reiterating the Differences: A Reply to Derrida," Glyph 1, Johns Hopkins University Press, 1977, pp. 198-208.

[4] Derrida, Jacques. "Limited Inc." Glyph 2, Johns Hopkins University Press, pp.162-256.

[5] Derrida, Jacques, La Voix et le Phénomène, Presses Universitaires de France, 1967.

[6] Austin, op. cit., pp. 130-131.

[7] See the remarks on Davidson's October 5th, 1967 lecture in Wheeler, Samuel C. III, (2012) "Remembering Donald Davidson: His 1967 Undergraduate Philosophy of Language Course" in Donald Davidson: Life and Words, edited by Maria Baghramian, Routledge, pp. 65-70.

[8] Derrida's discussion might be taken to have another point. In physical communication, a single entity, for instance a person, can pass through a communicating door to the next room. To call semantic communication by the same name is to invoke a metaphor that imposes a metaphysical picture on our thinking about what happens when we speak and write.