Rightness as Fairness: A Moral and Political Theory

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Marcus Arvan, Rightness as Fairness: A Moral and Political Theory, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 271pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137541802.

Reviewed by Richard Dees, University of Rochester


Marcus Arvan sets an ambitious project for himself. Using constraints on theory construction modeled on the sciences, he formulates a new moral theory that is supposed to solve all the controversial issues that have always surrounded ethics.

Leaning heavily on the claim that theories must have "Firm Foundations" -- i.e. that they must be "based on common human observation -- or observations that are taken to be obvious, incontrovertible fact by all or almost all observers" (15-16), Arvan claims that only instrumentalism qualifies as a possible theory of normativity. Only means-end rationality, he argues, is accepted by everyone as obviously true. Such a position leads either to some form of egoism or to an attempt to derive morality from self-interest. In effect, Arvan argues for the latter, though in a new way. It will surprise no one to hear that the effort fails. Nevertheless, Arvan has some interesting insights along the way.

Arvan tries to derive morality from instrumentalism by appealing to our uncertainty about our own futures. We cannot know the best means to our ends because we do not know how things will turn out, both because we do not know what will happen in the world and because we do not know what our own interests will turn out to be. The best we can do is to make probabilistic calculations, but such calculations only work on likely outcomes. But, he claims, we want more than a bet; we want to know the results, so we need to consider every possible outcome. But if we do so, we will realize that we can make no calculations at all:

The point here is simple. In . . . possible future selves cases, while the likely expected utility of cheating might be positive . . . there is nevertheless an infinite number of ways in which one's dominant interest -- in knowing one's future interests in advance -- can go unsatisfied. There are an infinite number of possible (if only unlikely) positive outcomes, and an infinite number of possible (if unlikely) negative outcomes. Since in a problem-case one cares about all of these possibilities, this means that the total expected utility of any action in which one 'bets' on outcomes is exactly zero: an infinite number of possible positive outcomes (+infinity) added to an infinite number of possible negative outcomes (-infinity). . . . it follows that no bet is instrumentally rational (98-99).

Arvan then proposes that we get out of the problem of future selves by appealing to what he calls the "Categorical-Instrumental Imperative":

voluntarily aim for its own sake, in every relevant action, to best satisfy the motivational interests it is instrumentally rational for one's present and every possible future self to universally agree upon given their voluntary, involuntary, and semivoluntary interests and co-recognition of the problem of possible future selves, where relevant actions are determined recursively as actions it is instrumentally rational for one's present and possible future selves to universally agree upon as such when confronted by the problem -- and then, when the future comes, voluntarily choose your having acted as such (92-93)

This principle is quite complicated, but the basic idea is that we should act on principles that we would choose for ourselves, no matter what our future holds, so that our future selves, whatever interest they have, will think that we acted correctly now. If we do so successfully, Arvan thinks, we get a bonus: each of our infinite possible future selves will regard its own interests as fulfilled, and so the expected outcome will be infinite. Morality, then, is instrumentally vindicated and indeed turns out to be uniquely optimal (97-102).

This first crucial move in the argument, however, is based on bad math. However many possibilities there are for our future, they are surely finite: I might live a large number of possible lives, but a large number is not infinite. Each of those lives will have a probability of occurring, but the sum of those probabilities cannot be more than 1. So the expected probability is less than the utility of the best life, which is certainly not infinite. Indeed, this consideration works even if we could live an infinite number of lives since the sum of the probabilities can still only be 1. But even if Arvan were correct in the first part of the calculation, the conclusion still would not follow: it is simply false that positive infinity plus negative infinity is zero. Mathematically, the answer is indeterminate.[1] So the argument for rejecting standard probabilistic means-end reasoning is simply mistaken.

The subsequent argument that moral actions have infinite worth because the expected value of the infinite possibilities is infinite is similarly wrong-headed. Even if all the other results of our choices did magically added up to zero, the result of the sum would be the value of the moral action.[2] In this case, I think, nothing important hangs on the mistake, but it shows how the reasoning in Arvan's account is faulty.

Yet even if all this reasoning were sound, the account Arvan gives depends not on uncontroversial claims about instrumental rationality, but on controversial assertions about how we should think about the relationship between our present selves and all our possible future selves and about how we should reason about them. His view simply falls well outside of our common understanding of instrumental rationality, and so it violates the Firm Foundations requirement in exactly the way he claims other moral theories do. And if these problems were not enough, Arvan simply assumes without argument that we must take a prudential care of our future selves, an assumption that Derek Parfit nimbly shows we should not take for granted.[3]

In some ways, we could stop our consideration of the theory at this point, but Arvan offers further arguments that raise interesting questions. If we grant him the truth of the Categorical-Instrumental Imperative, his next move is to note that to act on interests that satisfy our present selves and our future selves, we must take into account the fact that our future selves may come to identify with other people, alien races, and animals (118-28). But if we take this possibility seriously, then we must treat all those interests equally and so we must abstract away all our particular interests, including ones that favor ourselves (129).

But this move, like the first, goes too far. Why, exactly, I have to eliminate my own interests in a negotiation between my present interests and my future ones is a mystery. After all, in any negotiation between my present self and my future self, I know I will still be present. The bare possibility that I might have interests in others is not enough instrumentally to treat the interests of others as equal to my own. No matter what my future holds, for example, I will not be a black woman in the future, so it is simply false that from a prudential point of view, I should act like I might be. To make that claim, Arvan sneaks in a notion of fairness that simply is not a product of mere instrumental reasoning. I certainly endorse that idea of fairness, but it rests on a substantive moral assumption to which Arvan is not entitled.

However, if we allow this move, Arvan then argues that we must settle questions by appealing to a Moral Original Position in which we treat the interests of every creature as interests we might have ourselves (149). The Categorical-Instrumental Imperative then requires us to adopt a principle that would advance all these possible interests. From this point, his trick is to argue that we have a higher-order interest in insuring that our interests, whatever they turn out to be, can be pursued. He then claims that we can only pursue our interests if we are not coerced, so he establishes a prima facie principle against any form of coercion (159-66) and argues that we can pursue our interests only if we adopt a similar principle to obtain assistance from others when needed (167-68). Arvan recognizes that these two principles can come into conflict and that they may have costs, so he proposes a principle of fair negotiation to handle these issues: it requires us to settle questions about the distribution of costs through an actual bargaining process, but one which tries to approximate equality between all the parties, including the non-human ones. With all this machinery in place, Arvan concludes that an action is morally right when it satisfies the principles of non-coercion and assistance and in conformity with a fair negotiation that actually occurs. This conception he calls Rightness as Fairness (178).

In his derivation of the principles of non-coercion and assistance, Arvan makes a valuable argument. But once again, he goes too far. In the argument for the principle of fair negotiation, he casts aside most of his instrumentalist pretentions. We had been supposing that we were discussing an agreement between our present selves and potential future selves who might have interests in others. But we can't have any actual negotiations between our present and our future selves, and discussions of costs borne by one person rather than another would be out of place. Yet even if we accept that the principle requires actual negotiations between separate people, approximating equal bargaining power only makes sense if we already know what counts as the requisite form of equality. But equality is a morally loaded notion, which is supposed to be the product of the negotiations.

Nevertheless, Arvan takes the actual negotiation clause very seriously, citing it as one of the great advantages of his view. Because negotiations are required to determine the morality of any action, he dismisses the applied ethics literature as "fundamentally in error" because writers try to decide questions with reasoned discourse (182). Only with real, but fair, negotiations with actual people can we resolve the problems and thereby create the moral rules that apply. But to avoid the obvious problems with forcing people to negotiate for basic rights, he concedes that we do not need to negotiate with people who do not share a commitment to basic equality and to his principles of non-coercion and assistance to others (182-84). He somehow misses the fact that the most contentious debates -- those about abortion, women's rights, LGBTQI rights, and even about welfare rights -- are mostly about what is required to treat people equally and without coercion. On his grounds, then, these debates are not ones open to negotiations, but he thereby undermines the centrality of actual negotiations that are the hallmark of his theory.

Arvan emphasizes negotiations because he rightly observes that most human interactions are negotiated as we go, and he wants his moral theory to reflect that reality. His view has the nice effect that it would encourage people to think seriously about the trade-offs of various policies without trying to apply principles simplistically. But in practice the real-life negotiations that he promotes are either mere exercises in power or they are bounded by moral rules, rules that must be in place before the negotiations begin. The problem can be seen most clearly in Arvan's discussion of world poverty (194-96). He dismisses Peter Singer's famous argument for the claim that rich have a greater obligation to the poor by claiming it is a decontextualized application of an isolated case. We must also consider the interests of rich people who just want to get on with their lives. So it is a matter of negotiation, he says, whether the absolute poverty of the poor has more moral significance than the autonomy of the wealthy. So let's imagine this negotiation. Most plausibly, the rich get to do what they want because they have all the money and so they can decide whether or not to give any to the poor. Arvan would rightly protest that the negotiation must be fair and so it must give everyone equal bargaining power. But what is equal bargaining power here? If it is a simple majority vote, then the global poor will push for a principle that would require more generosity than even Singer proposes. If not, then the poor can always complain that their interests are not being considered fairly, and unless we have an independent moral standard already in place, we cannot dismiss their criticisms. So, on this issue, Arvan leaves us with an even bigger mess than when we started.

Alas, much the same can be said about the book as a whole. While Arvan presents many inventive arguments, he does not deliver on his promise to leave us with the more nuanced method for resolving difficult moral questions.

[1] To see why, take the following two sequences: 1, 2, 3, 4, 5 . . . and 1, 4, 9, 16, 25 . . . The sum of each sequence is infinite. By Arvan's logic, if we subtract the first from the second, we will get 0. But if we do so, we get the following sequence: 0, 2, 6, 12, 20 . . . But the sum of that sequence is also infinity.

[2] To see why, assume there are only four equally probable results with the non-moral utilities as follows: +10, -7, -3, and 0. But each gets the moral bonus, 6. So the net expected utility is .25(10+6) + .25(-7+6) + .25(-3+6) + .25(0+6) = 4.0 - 0.25 + 0.75 + 1.5 = 6.0.

[3] See Reasons and Persons (Clarendon Press, 1984), part two.