Rights: A Critical Introduction

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Tom Campbell, Rights: A Critical Introduction, Routledge, 2006, 229pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415281156.

Reviewed by William Edmundson, Georgia State University


This lively and accessible book is an "exercise in critical philosophy, focusing on the concept of rights" (xi). It is part of the series, Routledge Contemporary Political Philosophy, and is addressed to undergraduate students of political philosophy, law, and politics, as well as to more advanced readers seeking a synoptic overview.

The book is divided into four parts. Part I, "The Discourses of Rights," briefly traces the historical trajectory of rights discourse and offers a classification of types of rights. No introduction to rights would be complete without an exposition of Hohfeld's scheme of distinctions and correlations between claims, duties, liberties, "no-rights," powers, liabilities, immunities, and disabilities; and indeed one is offered here, followed by a brief characterization of Ronald Dworkin's distinction between right-based, duty-based, and goal-based moralities. There is a discussion of Bentham's interest (or "benefit") theory of rights and the competing choice (or "will") theory pioneered by H.L.A. Hart and championed by Carl Wellman, and the bearing of this dispute upon the questions: Who are the potential bearers of rights, what rights do they have, and -- for the author, the always distinct question -- what rights ought they have? Part I concludes with a schematic account of leading political theories -- Rawlsian contractualism, classical liberalism, communitarianism, republicanism, and feminism -- and of the distinctive approaches they offer for determining the content of rights. Part II, "The Institutions of Rights," examines the several modes by which rights are protected and thus (in the author's view) made real. Part III, "Three Human Rights," examines a prominent human right representative of each of the three so-called "generations" of rights: free speech (a first-generation "negative" right of individuals against the state), sustenance (a second-generation "positive" right of individuals), and self-determination (a third-generation "group" right). Part IV, "A Theory of Rights," summarizes and defends the author's own general account of rights, which he calls "democratic positivism," whose influence is evident throughout the book.

Rights are currently held in high regard, owing to their claim to priority over other considerations, their attentiveness to the individual, their common association with fortifying remedies, their purported decisiveness in settling controversy, their promise of security and, finally, their aspiration to universality. These attractions are brought into doubt by various skeptical critiques -- some conceptual, some normative, some empirical, and some mixed -- that are aimed at what critics perceive to be "the egoism, the legalism, the dogmatism, and the elitism of rights" (11). It is the author's aim to rescue the reputation of rights from the critics. The egoism charge is deftly avoided with the observation that "the fact that egoistical people are selfish about how they use their rights does not mean that having and asserting rights is necessarily a selfish activity" (14). The legalism charge is one I will discuss further, since the author's democratic positivism seems to exhibit a greater than usual vulnerability to it where moral rights are at issue. The dogmatism critique is taken in a way that the author seems to believe to be avoidable (only) by adopting a cautious metaethics of rights -- I will return to this too. Finally, the elitism charge is resisted by giving a populist spin to the conception of democracy at work in the author's democratic positivism.

According to the author, a theory of rights has to say what rights are, who (and what) can be rightsholders, what rights they have, what rights they ought to have, and how rights are best secured. In the domain of moral rights, as opposed to social and legal rights, this list may seem duplicative insofar as the questions, "what rights do candidate rightsholders have?" and "what rights ought they have?" seem to be, if not identical, then barely worth distinguishing. The author concedes that it is widely believed that there are moral rights that "exist independently of existing social and legal norms" (28), and which can serve as critical standards by which to judge the justice of conventional norms. But the author resists this position: his democratic positivism insists that "it is more satisfactory to interpret this [critical] sort of moral rights talk as a matter of giving reasons for asserting what legal and societal rules there ought to be" (28). Presumably, then, the author would have disapproved references in the United States in 1850 to an African slave's moral right to be free, except as a misleading way of urging reasons favoring the promulgation of a legal right. "Hunger is not bread," as Bentham remarked to make a similar point against natural rights. Joel Feinberg suggested, and the author adopts, the term "manifesto rights" for moral grounds for establishing as-yet-unrecognized rights.

Undoubtedly, there is a difference between controversial rights and consensus rights, and between effectively protected rights and routinely violated rights. But why think that these differences make it unsatisfactory, from the perspective of a critical theory, to allow the African slave, for example, to complain of a continuing violation of a moral (and "natural law") right he already has? The author's answer is that to be committed to the existence of unrecognized moral rights is to be committed to an ontological thesis that unnecessarily invites skepticism and charges of dogmatism. Rights presuppose rules, and rules have a "social existence" along the lines described by H.L.A. Hart. To assert the existence of a right despite the absence of a social rule is, the author claims, to assert that "moral rules have an objective reality that is independent of human beliefs and practices" (29). To avoid this ontological thesis, the author adopts the position that "the discourse of moral rights is best seen as a moral evaluation as to what social or legal rights people ought to have" (29). Two comments seem to me worth making. The first is that the author seems utterly complacent about the ontological status of moral reasons, as opposed to that of moral rights. But that complacency is unjustified. Whatever grounds there are to doubt the independent existence of moral rights are grounds to doubt the independent existence of moral reasons. The author might insist that moral rights, unlike moral reasons, are conceptually tied to rules, which in turn presuppose the existence of a social practice. But this line requires supporting argument, and none is offered. Second, the author's empirical thesis, that a discourse of "manifesto rights" can duplicate for the oppressed every advantage of a discourse of moral rights, is unsupported and likely false. Social psychological phenomena such as the "endowment effect" show that people are much readier to fight to keep what they believe is theirs than to struggle to attain what isn't. In short, the author's position on moral rights is motivated by an unargued metaethical fastidiousness and ignores an important dimension of the real-world utility of rights discourse.

The ill effects of treating moral rights in this positivistic way are aggravated by the author's insistence that candidate rights are epistemologically posterior to the duties correlative to them:

It is not that we identify rights and then look to see who has, or ought to have, the correlative duties, rather, only when we can be sure that there is a correlative duty can we say that there is, or ought to be, a corresponding right. (129)

The author does not mention, much less rebut, the opposite view, held by Joseph Raz and Jeremy Waldron, that the discourse of rights enables moral progress precisely because it does not confine deliberation to boundaries determined by a prior fixing of duties and duty-bearers.

Fortunately, the book offers many insights that theoretical consistency might have suppressed. For example, the discussion of freedom of speech reveals that first-generation "noninterference" rights tend to generate second-generation "access" rights. The empiricism underlying the author's democratic positivism helpfully focuses certain enquiries: the author astutely notes, for example, that the second-generation right to at least minimal sustenance makes a demand much more amenable to objective measurement than, say, the first-generation right to privacy (162).

The concluding chapter brings together earlier threads of discussion in a way that weaves them into a general if schematic defense of democratic positivism as a theory of rights. The defense of the positivism never goes much deeper than an (irrelevant) insistence upon the "is/ought" distinction and an unelaborated assertion that

Once we say that there are moral rights which somehow or other exist whatever the social and legal realities of life for those who are said to have these moral rights, then we are on the way to destroying the distinctive usefulness of the idea of rights and leaving ourselves at the mercy of whoever, be it courts, priests, or neighbours, who determines what these moral rights are to be in practice. (196)

But mustn't democratic positivism similarly leave us at the mercy of the demos? The "democratic" component of democratic positivism, the author confesses, "may be considered paradoxical," given the "contemporary commonplace… that we need rights to limit and control democracy… ." (197). Democratic positivism "does not rule out… entirely" such counter-majoritarian devices as entrenched constitutional rights and judicial review, but the author would prefer to protect minorities by striving "to develop in a society certain types of moral belief," which presumably must not include the belief that minorities already possess rights against the majority that the majority is bound to respect whether or not it has yet done so (199). In fine, democratic positivism's definition of rights as "legitimate expectations, arising from the adoption of authoritative rules and the institutions that support them" answers the question, "what rights do we have?" by telling us to "consult the rules" (204). The author's concession that "rights, as conceived in this book, do involve a strong dose of legalism" (201) will not mollify readers who will find such an approach to moral and human rights excessively -- perhaps even incoherently -- legalistic. Nonetheless, the reader who is able to take democratic positivism with a grain of salt will find much of value here. An appendix provides the inquisitive reader with a useful "literature map" and an extensive bibliography. Judged by its aim to provide a "critical introduction," the book succeeds quite admirably.