Rights and Demands: A Foundational Inquiry

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Margaret Gilbert, Rights and Demands: A Foundational Inquiry, Oxford University Press, 2018, 369pp., $54.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198813767.

Reviewed by Gopal Sreenivasan, Duke University


This is an excellent book, rich, rewarding, and ambitious. Margaret Gilbert treats a wide range of topics not often considered together: rights, promising, agreements, and joint commitment. Indeed, according to the theory of rights she advances, a proper understanding of rights (or at least, of a central class of rights) actually depends on weaving these topics together. All are topics on which Gilbert has published extensively before.[1]

I shall concentrate on Gilbert's analysis of rights, the central and novel thread in this book. My focus will be her exposition of what she calls the 'demand-right problem' (79) together with her solution. Demand-rights are the central class of rights that Gilbert's theory of rights addresses.

One way to introduce the idea of a demand-right is in terms of the equivalence:

  1. X has a demand-right against Y to Y's phi-ing if and only if Y is obligated to X to phi (70).

Readers familiar with Wesley Hohfeld's canonical analysis of rights may understandably wonder how demand-rights, so defined, differ from Hohfeld's 'claims,' since Gilbert's equivalence appears identical to Hohfeld's (apart from the italicised expression). To some extent, the answer is that they do not differ. It is simply that Gilbert wants to hone in on an aspect of claims (or 'claim-rights') that is often neglected, while also not wanting to get caught up in the infighting between, say, the will theory of rights and the interest theory of rights, which is frequently framed in Hohfeld's terminology.

To identify this neglected aspect of rights, we should consider a second equivalence that Gilbert affirms:

  1. X has a demand-right against Y [to Y's phi-ing] if and only if X has the standing to demand of Y that Y phi (70).

'Standing to demand' of someone that he or she perform some action is, in the sense that interests Gilbert, a matter of 'having the authority to demand' that the person so act (57). Authoritative demands are distinguished both from mere demands and from authoritative commands. Anyone can, in some sense, 'demand' anything of anyone. But if the person making the demand -- an armed robber, say (58) -- lacks the standing or authority to demand what he does -- 'your money or your life,' say -- then all we have is a mere demand, which is not Gilbert's subject. Unlike authoritative commands, however, demands do not create a right against the person to whom they are addressed, not even when the agent issuing them has the requisite standing, but rather they presuppose that the issuer of the demand already has a right against its addressee [to the performance demanded] (62).

Gilbert's further explication of this crucial notion of standing to demand follows H.L.A. Hart in two signal respects. First, she invokes Hart's observation that there is a 'special congruity' in the use or threat of force to secure performances to which one has a right (62). Noting that demands can involve a purely verbal form of force, Gilbert quotes approvingly from John Skorupski that 'demanding is already a form of enforcement' (63). Second, like Hart, she highlights promising as a paradigmatic context in which the standing to demand arises (64-70). Not only is the promisor obligated, to the promisee, to perform as promised, but equally the promisee has standing to demand of the promisor that he or she so perform. To put it colloquially, the promisor's performance of the promise is the promisee's 'business' -- despite not being the business of others generally -- and one element of its being the promisee's business is precisely her standing to demand that the promisor perform. In Hart's loftier language, which Gilbert also channels (78), the promisee is a 'small-scale sovereign' with respect to the promisor's performance of the promise.

Before turning to the 'problem' of demand-rights that animates Gilbert's discussion, we should record that it is not clear that her re-labelling of claim-rights as demand-rights is very effective at insulating the phenomenon of having standing to demand from the infighting in the rights literature. After all, as Gilbert herself accepts (71), her equivalences (1) and (2) together entail a third equivalence, namely,

  1. Y is obligated to X to phi if and only if X has the standing to demand of Y that Y phi.

But the infighting on Hohfeld's terrain is almost as often framed in terms of directed duties (Y's duty to X) or obligations as it is in terms of claim-rights. Hence any problem this infighting creates is as apt to infect discussions of 'standing to demand' via (3) as to infect them via (2); and yet no rights figure in (3) at all. We shall return to this point.

In Gilbert's official formulation, the demand-right problem is to explain 'how it is possible to accrue the standing to demand' (79). What Gilbert is after, more specifically, is an explanation of the grounds of standing to demand (80). She counts Hart, for example, as not having solved the problem, despite evidently regarding him as having an adequate understanding of what standing to demand is -- both of how it is related to claim-rights and directed duties and that it characteristically arises with promises. At best, she says, Hart's analysis presupposes the standing to demand, but does not explain it (97). Indeed, the burden of chapter 5 is to show that no theorist of rights has yet solved the demand-right problem. Her principal targets here are Judith Thomson, Joseph Raz, and Hart.

How, then, is the demand-right problem to be solved? In a phrase, Gilbert's solution is 'joint commitment' (159). More precisely, her solution proceeds in two steps. Its first step argues that joint commitment constitutes 'a' ground of the standing to demand (169). The second step is to argue, furthermore, that there are no other grounds. Strictly speaking, Gilbert does not really try to discharge this second step. Instead, she floats the 'joint-commitment conjecture,' which holds that 'all demand-rights are grounded in a joint commitment' (183); and partially supports it by examining and rejecting some alternative grounds. Some of these were covered in chapter 5 and others are taken up later (centrally, in chapter 11, where she examines Hart's famous transcendental argument for a natural right to be free and some considerations from Stephen Darwall).

I shall pay more attention to her first step, without going very deeply into the nature of joint commitment on Gilbert's view. Commitments of the will fall into two species, joint and personal. Joint commitment differs from parallel personal commitments: among other things, it is a genuine co-creation without parts (164). As she summarises nicely, joint commitment is a psychological process with a normative upshot (181). Two people are jointly committed if and only if they have jointly committed themselves (process) (161); at the same time, one is 'committed in some way if and only if there is something that, all else being equal, one ought to do' (product) (162). Joint commitment therefore involves some pro tanto normative constraint on its parties. While Gilbert takes this constraint to be 'peremptory' (163; 171), she also distinguishes the relevant species of normativity sharply from either moral normativity or institutional normativity. It belongs to some third realm.

At its core, Gilbert's first step comprises 'an intuitive judgement, plus an explanation of that judgement' (169). However, there is also a vital background move. To wit, she simply assumes that obligations or pro tanto normative constraints can be willed into existence. In fact, she builds this feature in, by definition, to what 'commitments of the will' are. Alternatively, then, what she assumes is that commitments of the will, so defined, actually exist (162). This plays a fundamental role in her analysis of promising, where she maintains that the promisor's directed obligation to the promisee is willed into existence as a matter of joint commitment (160). Of course, Gilbert is well aware that this position is controversial, having earlier discussed Hume's famous scepticism about the possibility of willing promissory obligations into existence (chapter 6). But her reply to Hume is that he takes promissory obligations to be moral obligations, whereas in her view they are not moral, but rather a species of non-moral practical normativity; and this is supposed to make all the difference. I am perfectly happy to accept that there is some such third species of practical normativity. Still, it would have been nice to get some account of what difference exactly is made by construing promissory obligations in this way and why that difference is decisive in defusing Hume's scepticism.

The intuitive judgement Gilbert invites us to share is that each party to a joint commitment, as such, has standing to demand of any other party to the same commitment that he or she honour the commitment. Her idea is that the joint commitment establishes a relationship between the parties to it that supplies each of them with standing to demand of any other parties that they conform to their commitment. For example, a promise establishes such a relationship between two people. To explain the basis of this judgement, Gilbert invokes an implication of her background move. Specifically, parties to a joint commitment have this standing to demand, she submits, because they have together imposed the normative constraint in question on each other (170). Accordingly, the demand each party can make -- that another party to the commitment conform to it -- is made in the capacity each party has as 'co-author' of the very commitment the addressee is being demanded to perform (171). This co-authorship is what underwrites the standing to make such demands.

I agree with Gilbert that standing to demand performance of the correlative duty (by the duty bearer) is a neglected aspect of claim-rights, one that is well worth exploring and taking more seriously. I also agree that her joint commitment account offers a plausible sufficient ground of the standing to demand -- certainly if one grants its background assumptions. So this makes for a very valuable contribution. Moreover, since promises are but one example of a joint commitment (e.g., there are also agreements, and perhaps more), the scope of her analysis is wider than we have considered explicitly.

However, I am afraid it is also true that, ultimately, Gilbert has over-reached. In particular, I think it is a clear mistake to make standing to demand pivotal to the analysis of claim-rights per se, as Gilbert tries to do. To substantiate this diagnosis, I shall articulate two fundamental philosophical objections to her central line of analysis. I then close by briefly discussing two secondary objections concerning Gilbert's relation to positions in the literature.

Each of my main objections takes issue with one of the directions in which Gilbert's biconditional (3) runs. Let me begin with its necessity direction. For the sake of argument, let us assume that the second step of Gilbert's solution to the demand-right problem is correct. In other words, there are no grounds of standing to demand besides joint commitment. Ironically, the problem arises because Gilbert follows Hart too closely while also not following him closely enough.

Hart's theory of rights is modeled on two paradigmatic cases of claim-rights -- promissory (or contractual) rights and property rights. As we have seen, Gilbert attends carefully to promissory rights. Unfortunately, she largely ignores property rights. This makes for trouble because property rights turn out to be a counter-example to the necessity of standing to demand (at least when this is grounded in joint commitment). To appreciate why, we need to see where Gilbert should have parted company with Hart.

Some time ago, Jeremy Waldron astutely observed that Hart conflates two capital distinctions in the theory of rights,[2] the distinction between rights in personam and rights ad rem and the distinction between special rights and general rights. The first distinction concerns a difference in the structure of rights, whereas the second concerns a difference in the grounds of rights. As Waldron also pointed out, the distinctions are orthogonal, since rights ad rem can be either special rights or general rights.

Rights ad rem are held 'against the world.' That is, everyone (else) bears the correlative duty. By contrast, rights in personam are held against certain specific persons only. Not everyone bears the correlative duty, but only those specific others. General rights are rights where the grounds of the right are such that if anyone satisfies them, everyone satisfies them (and hence, everyone has the right). By contrast, special rights are rights where the grounds of the right are such that only some people may satisfy them (in which case, only some people will have the right).

Promissory rights are both special and in personam. Only the promisor has the correlative duty (rather than everyone) and only the promisee holds the claim-right (because only she satisfies its special ground, i.e. being the recipient of the promise). A claim-right not to be tortured is both general and ad rem. Everyone has this claim-right and each person holds it against everyone else.

Now property rights are also rights ad rem. Everyone has a duty to the owner of Blackacre not to enter it without her permission (or, as Hohfeld has it, 'to stay off the place'). However, there is no fixed answer to the question of whether property rights are general rights or special rights, since the grounds of the right will vary with our theory of property (for Waldron, this was the payoff to his point about Hart). On Locke's theory, for example, property is a special right, since its ground is labouring (which only some may satisfy), whereas on Hegel's theory, property is a general right, since its ground is personality (which everyone satisfies).

All this is highly relevant to Gilbert's project because, whatever else it is, joint commitment is a special ground. Not everyone satisfies it, but only those who are actually party to the relevant joint commitment (which requires a psychological process). In this respect, joint commitment is well suited to explain promissory rights (and the promisee's concomitant standing to demand). Of course, it is possible to explain rights ad rem on this model, as long as we are prepared to postulate that each property owner has made a joint commitment with everyone else in the world (to stay off the place). As it happens, this yields the parallel for standing to demand of Grotius' theory of property rights, on which the ground of property is consent. (Grotius infamously embraced the postulate his theory therefore required, namely, a worldwide compact to institute property rights -- but he was justly ridiculed for this, notably by Filmer and Locke).

My first objection, then, is that Gilbert's analysis of standing to demand commits us to a false postulate about property rights -- that there is a worldwide joint commitment covering their correlative duties. Nor can this bullet be dodged by saying that we are concerned with demand-rights, rather than claim-rights, and that perhaps there really are no demand-rights to property. For the left-hand side of (3) concerns directed duties, not rights, and for any parcel of property everyone else plainly has some duty to the owner (e.g., to stay off the place). To be clear, I see no reason to deny that a property owner also has standing to demand of everyone that she perform her correlative duty. So far as that goes, (3) itself actually remains in good order, even in the case of property rights. But then either the joint commitment conjecture is false (because the standing to demand enjoyed by property owners is not grounded in joint commitment) or 'standing to demand' is not a univocal expression (because it varies as between promissory and property rights), in which case it is hardly suited to an analysis of claim-rights per se.

Consider now the sufficiency direction in (3). Is someone with standing to demand of Y that Y phi (or, indeed, to demand that Y perform Y's duty to phi) always also a terminus of Y's duty, i.e., a person to whom this duty is owed? No doubt the same person often fills both roles, as the discussion of promising illustrates. But my second objection is that this is not necessarily always the case. Earlier we said, colloquially, that a person has standing to demand performance of a duty when its performance is her business. In Anglo-Saxon culture, it is fair to say, the performance of most duties is not regarded as everyone's business. If Y owes X a debt, for example, Y's repaying X is not regarded as the business of random third parties and they have no standing to demand of Y that Y repay X. In previously contrasting the promisee's position with the general case, we invoked this very understanding as background.

Still, Anglo-Saxon culture may be mistaken on this point. What is whose business is a substantive question of morality (or practical normativity, if you prefer); and other times and places have understood it differently. For example, my mother used to recount stories of when my brother and I were toddlers, in Germany, where she was always taken aback by how commonly she was accosted with us in public -- mostly in the English Gardens, of all places -- by well-meaning strangers, keen to correct a new mother on some aspect of child rearing. They evidently took themselves to have standing to demand of her that she perform her motherly duties properly. I do not know whether everyone was supposed to have standing to demand of anyone that he perform any old duty of his or whether such standing was confined to matters of child care (with perhaps only experienced mothers having it?).

However things may have been in Germany in the 1960s, we can certainly imagine a moral culture in which a norm of universal busybodying is affirmed. It does not even take much imagination. According to Locke, everyone in the state of nature has the right to 'execute' the law of nature, by which he means to enforce its duties. This right is, precisely, a grant of authority. Thus, in Locke's state of nature, random third parties do have standing to demand of Y that Y perform his duty to repay X. Of course, with Locke, their authority also includes coercion, which is not what Gilbert has in mind. To align the accounts, we could retreat to a merely 'tut, tut' analogue of Locke's right to execute the law of nature. All the same, everyone so endowed has standing to demand of anyone that he perform any of his duties.

I am not suggesting that either Locke or the matrons of the English Gardens were correct about who has standing to demand what. It does not really matter whose position on this score is correct, since a theory of rights should hold independently of substantive morality. My point is rather that, even if Locke were correct, it clearly should not follow that Y's duty to repay X is owed to the random third parties who have standing to demand that Y repay X. Yet either that is what (3) entails or there is again an ambiguity -- though perhaps a different one -- in 'standing to demand.' Hence my objection.

Despite crediting third parties, random or otherwise, with the authority to execute the law of nature, Locke himself certainly did not think that they had claim-rights against Y that Y repay X. Nor, presumably, did the matrons think they had claim-rights against my mother that she raise us properly. On these views, claim-rights sometimes fail to accompany standing to demand, which is the correct result. Ditto for the termini of directed duties. But Gilbert's biconditional (3) cannot accommodate this outcome.

Finally, let me comment very briefly on Gilbert's treatment of two established figures in the literature. Inevitably, the first is Hart, who serves as her central point of reference. For all that, it seems to me that Hart's position is actually even closer to Gilbert's than she lets on. It is true that he does not try to explain the grounds of anything, neither of rights nor of the various elements with which he identifies rights. So there remains that important difference.

Still, standing to demand performance of this or that duty is not merely something Hart recognises and presupposes. It fits very neatly into his scheme, as one detail among others. Gilbert concedes that demanding is a 'kind of enforcement mechanism' (77). More than that, it can be seen as a fourth 'measure of control' over a duty, to go along with Hart's three canonical measures, any one of which suffices (on his view) to qualify someone as the correlative right-holder. Tying the knot yet tighter, 'demanding' performance of a duty can be seen as the negative flip-side of Hart's most basic measure of control: it is (pointedly) omitting to exercise one's power to waive the duty. (Gilbert effectively concedes this, too [172].) What unifies all of these details, for Hart, is that they represent means of channeling the right-holder's will.

If this is right, Gilbert has three difficult questions to confront. First, what is the justification for privileging one of these measures (standing to demand) over all of the others in a theory of rights? Second, can the ground or justification for any one measure really be settled in isolation from that of the others? (Gilbert never enquires after the ground of the power to waive, e.g.). Third, given that their positions are so close, is Gilbert not equally vulnerable to the classical objections against Hart's theory? For example, how does she handle agents who are incapable of making demands (or, for that matter, joint commitments)?

The second figure is Raz. Unlike Hart, or indeed almost anyone else in the literature, Raz focuses squarely on the grounds or justification of rights. On his view, simplifying a little, X holds a claim-right correlative to Y's duty just in case X's interest is, other things equal, sufficient to justify imposing that duty on Y. What qualifies X as the correlative right-holder is the role of X's well-being in justifying Y's duty.

Raz himself does not address Gilbert's demand-right problem, though this would not be the first time he had solved a puzzle without attending to it explicitly. Nevertheless, I do not understand why Gilbert does not count Raz as having (perhaps, unwittingly) provided sufficient conditions for explaining the grounds of standing to demand. She considers this question, but simply rejects the possibility without elaboration (90-91). It does not fit her narrative, I realise, insofar as it falsifies the joint-commitment conjecture. However, some explanation for rejecting it seems in order.

Let me spell out why Raz's account might be thought to contain just such sufficient grounds. Holding other things equal, if X's interest is sufficient to justify imposing the duty on Y in the first place, surely it also suffices to justify X's standing to demand of Y that Y perform the duty? After all, imposing the duty originally is presumably harder to justify than giving X standing to demand its performance. How can X's interest be sufficient for the harder task, while being inadequate to the easier one?

As I mentioned at the beginning, there is much here that I have not been able to cover: an in-depth theory of promises, a separate account of agreements, as well as discussions of legal rights and of human rights. Margaret Gilbert's book is a real accomplishment, one which both demands close reading and serious engagement and very much repays it.

[1] For example, M. Gilbert, Joint Commitment: How we make the social world. New York: Oxford University Press, 2014.

[2] J. Waldron, The Right to Private Property. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988.