Rights Angles

Placeholder book cover

Loren E. Lomasky, Rights Angles, Oxford University Press, 2016, 387pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190263959.

Reviewed by Matt Zwolinski, University of San Diego


Philosophical advocates of libertarianism have long been divided into two main camps. In one are the followers of John Locke, who ground their libertarianism in a natural right of self-ownership, combined with the ability to acquire strong rights of private property in natural resources through some form of original appropriation or free exchange. Among academic philosophers, the uncontested champion of this camp is Robert Nozick, though Ayn Rand and Murray Rothbard have remained popular "outsider" favorites.

In the other camp are the consequentialists, who support the libertarian ideal of free markets and limited government because and to the extent that those institutions can be reliably expected to yield better results than any alternative. The inspirations and champions of this camp are more diverse, but many draw inspiration from either the rationalist ideas of Ludwig von Mises or the evolutionary social theory of Friedrich von Hayek. Richard Epstein and David Friedman head up the moderate and more radical factions, respectively.

For some time now, however, a loud, booming voice has sounded from outside the confines of these two camps. That voice has proclaimed that while the goal pursued by both camps is (for the most part) laudable, the philosophical justifications they provide are flawed. Neither self-ownership nor the maximization of utility are sufficiently grounded in a theory of practical reason to provide a convincing account of why moral agents should care about the constraints and values they suggest, let alone why they should afford them a paramount position in their overall plan of life. But a grounding in practical reason is not merely a matter of providing the correct justification for some independently specified libertarian theory. Rather, the form of justification also defines the limits of the nature of the theory that can be justified. Some form of libertarian theory can be grounded in an account of practical reason, but it might not be precisely the form with which we have become acquainted through the work of Nozick, Rothbard, et al.

That booming voice belongs to Loren Lomasky, whose distinctive theory of libertarian rights received its most extended and systematic treatment in his 1987 book, Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community. Since that time, Lomasky has published a number of essays refining his view, defending it against rivals both within and without the two libertarian camps, and exploring its implications for questions of global justice, social welfare policy, and the right to free association. Many of those essays are now collected together in his new book, which has as its unifying theme the nature, foundation, and application of a libertarian theory of rights.[1] The book contains 16 of Lomasky's essays, three of which were published prior to his earlier book,[2] twelve of which were published after, and one of which appears in this book for the first time.

The new essay, "Everything Old is New Again: The Death and Rebirth of Classical Liberal Philosophy," examines why classical liberalism fell into disfavor toward the end of the nineteenth century (to be replaced by the progressive liberalism of Leonard Hobhouse, John Dewey, and later John Rawls), and why it is in the midst of a resurgence today. Much of this story is familiar to students of classical liberalism and/or twentieth century political philosophy. The most interesting part of the essay is its coda, in which Lomasky points out several areas in which classical liberal theory is weak or underdeveloped. This section provides a wonderful set of research opportunities for future scholars interested in classical liberalism. For instance, how should classical liberals deal with problems of intergenerational justice, such as those involved in the creation of debt? If a minimal state or larger-than-minimal sate is justifiable on classical liberal principles, what method of taxation is morally justified in order to finance it? And how should classical liberals deal with the rectification of past injustice?

The remaining essays are not organized into separate parts, but they fall roughly into three thematic groups. The first group (consisting of essays 2 through 5) deals with the moral foundations of liberalism, especially with the choice between utilitarian and rights-based approaches. The second group (essays 6 through 8) explores the contours of liberal rights theory. And the final group (essays 9 through 16) applies Lomasky's theory of rights to a variety of contexts, and contrasts it with some rival approaches.

Within the first group of essays, a great deal of space is devoted to discussing the merits and shortcomings of utilitarian moral theory as a foundation for politics. That Lomasky approaches this subject with at least a hint of ambivalence is natural, given the complicated relationship classical liberals have had with utilitarianism for the last 150 years or so. On the one hand, many of the earliest classical liberals (Hume, Bentham, Mill) were either utilitarians or proto-utilitarians. On the other, one could plausibly argue that it was precisely the ascendency of utilitarianism as a public philosophy that contributed to the demise of classical liberalism in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries.[3]

A great deal of Lomasky's "A Refutation of Utilitarianism" is actually devoted to showing why many of the standard objections against utilitarianism don't work. The fundamental problem with utilitarianism, for him, is not that it sanctions injustice or the breaking of promises, but that it fails to respect and take seriously the separateness of persons. Unlike Rawls and Nozick, however, who merely invoke this phrase without doing much to explain or justify it, Lomasky supports this objection through a well-developed account of practical reason and its relation to morality. For Lomasky, a meaningful life, indeed our very identity as individuals, is largely a function of the commitments or projects we undertake and pursue. Those projects provide a "structure and significance" to our lives, helping us to choose among competing values and activities, and even ruling out certain values and activities as fundamentally incompatible with our deepest commitments (35).

Utilitarianism fails to respect each person's commitment to his or her own, distinctive projects. Instead, utilitarianism demands that we all conform our lives to the same, single project -- the "ceaseless and perpetual endeavor to maximize utility" (54). But it is entirely unclear what reason individuals are supposed to have to conform to such an all-encompassing project. If that is what morality demands, then "why be moral" is not simply a question for recalcitrant skeptics. It is a question for anyone who cares about securing a space in which they can pursue their own values in their own way.

Such space is precisely what a theory of liberal rights affords us, Lomasky argues in "Personal Projects as the Foundation for Basic Rights." As project pursuers, we require non-interference from others in order to devote ourselves to the things that matter to us (but perhaps not to others). But because others value the pursuit of their projects, they require non-interference as well. What gets us from valuing non-interference for ourselves, on Lomasky's view, to being willing to extend it to others, is not empathy nor mere logical consistency. It is, rather, a kind of reciprocity. We respect the right of others to non-interference because we value non-interference ourselves, and respecting others' rights is the only way to get it.

An account like this provides a satisfying answer to the "why be moral" kind of question, at least for most people, most of the time. But attempts to ground rights in reciprocity are not without their own well-known problems.[4] If the only reason to respect the rights of others is the threat potential they wield against us, then why respect the putative rights of those who pose no threat -- children, the weak, and so on? Why respect the rights of even the strong if we find ourselves in a situation where violating those rights promises significant benefits and little chance of detection? Unfortunately, Lomasky has little to say about these challenges in the essays collected in this book.[5]

He does, however, touch on a closely related issue, with fascinating results. Consider those persons who lack the material resources necessary to live a decent life (putting aside for now the difficulty involved in precisely specifying that threshold). On Lomasky's view of rights, such persons would have no compelling reason to respect the property rights of others, if doing so meant condemning themselves to destitution. They would, however, have reason to respect a system of rights which both (a) generally protected the property rights of individuals, and (b) guaranteed some minimum level of provision sufficient to ensure that a decent life was within the reach of all. Thus, on Lomasky's view, a limited set of positive welfare rights are not only compatible with classical liberalism, but required by the very same considerations that justify classical liberalism in the first place.

The idea here is fascinating, even if it leaves the reader wishing for more details regarding the precise contours of the argument. Much of the discussion takes place in an essay on "Compensation and the Bounds of Rights," which uses Joel Feinberg's famous story of the lost hiker caught in a blizzard to ask when rights may be permissibly infringed. The guiding idea is that just as the hiker would have no compelling reason to respect a system of rights that required him to freeze to death rather than break into an unoccupied cabin, neither would a poverty-stricken individual have reason to respect a system of property rights that required her to starve rather than steal a loaf of bread. But Lomasky adds a series of qualifications to this idea, claiming that, for instance, while an innocently lost hiker would be entitled to break into the cabin, one who got lost in the course of reckless thrill-seeking would not. These restrictions presumably have the effect of limiting eligibility for welfare rights as well. The problem, however, is that his arguments for them are entirely intuitive in nature. It's not clear whether, or how, they are grounded in the logic of reciprocity that is supposed to undergird the whole system of rights on Lomasky's own view. What reason does even a reckless hiker have to respect the property rights of the cabin owner?

The third group of essays is, by its nature, considerably more diverse in its topics than either of the first two. It contains one of my favorite essays by Lomasky, "Libertarianism at Twin Harvard," which acquaints us with Twin John Rawls (a robust libertarian) and Twin Robert Nozick (who endorses sweeping state redistribution in the name of justice), and argues, provocatively, that Twin Rawls and Nozick are on better philosophical ground than their counterparts in our world.

Another pair of essays in the third group highlights the interesting place of classical liberalism between more radical forms of libertarianism on the one hand, and contemporary progressive liberalism on the other, with respect to questions of political authority and national borders. Against more progressive liberals (such as Stephen Macedo), classical liberals tend to de-emphasize the moral relevance of national boundaries, denying for instance that a concern to achieve social justice at home can justify excluding potential immigrants. Tending to take a more cosmopolitan view of human rights, classical liberals have generally argued that the same principles of free trade, free movement, and peace that ought to govern individuals within a state also ought to govern the relationships of individuals between states. This cosmopolitan vision is on display in Lomasky's essay, "Liberalism Beyond Borders," a sort of précis of his recent book with Fernando Teson, Justice at a Distance: Extending Freedom Globally.

As we have seen, however, Lomasky's view of rights is not the standard neo-Lockean account most commonly associated with libertarianism. For him, rights are not moral facts inherent in our nature as human beings. Rather, they are phenomena that emerge out of reciprocal relationships between rational project-pursuers. One should not expect, then, that Lomaskian rights will be perfectly cosmopolitan in the way that, say, Nozickian rights would be. And thus we should expect -- and we do in fact find -- significant differences between Lomasky's views on the role of nations and those of more radical libertarians.

These differences are on display in "Toward a Liberal Theory of National Borders." Here, Lomasky sets forth a classical liberal argument in defense of political authority and national borders. Eschewing the consent theory more popular among Lockean libertarians, Lomasky instead grounds his argument on the Kantian idea that the formation of civil society is morally mandatory as a way of establishing a morally secure zone in which individuals can pursue their projects in relative autonomy. Boundaries against likely rights-violators assist in establishing that security, while at the same time also providing groups of individuals with a framework within which to establish institutions for the provision of public goods, and to pursue shared ideals of community. But borders can serve these functions, according to Lomasky, while still being relatively soft -- that is, easily traversable by people and goods. A morally defensible border between the United States and Mexico would look less like the border between East and West Berlin, and more like the border between Michigan and Ohio.

This book is a superb collection of philosophy, with a great deal to offer philosophers interested in classical liberalism, theories of rights, and contemporary issues of global justice. But one need not be a specialist in any of these areas to benefit from it. Lomasky is, in addition to being a talented and provocative philosopher, a gifted writer with a remarkable wit. Right or wrong, the essays collected in this book are thus without exception clear, accessible, and simply good fun to read.

[1] Lomasky identifies himself in the introduction to this book as "strong and committed libertarian" (ix). Elsewhere in the book, however, he draws a distinction between libertarianism and classical liberalism, identifying the former as a subclass of the latter. Classical liberals, for Lomasky, are those who hold that "the preponderance of basic rights individuals possess are negative," while libertarians maintain more strictly that "all basic rights are negative" (155). On this more strict (and precise) usage, Lomasky is a classical liberal, but not a libertarian.

[2] The dust jacket and Oxford University Press website erroneously state that all of the essays in the book were published after Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community.

[3] See, for an example of such an argument, George Smith, The System of Liberty (Cambridge, 2013).

[4] See, for a discussion, Allen Buchanan, "Justice as Reciprocity Versus Subject-Centered Justice," Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 19, no. 3 (Summer, 1990), pp. 227-252.

[5] Lomasky does, to his credit, devote a chapter of his earlier Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community to the rights of children.