Rights, Wrongs and Responsibilities

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Kramer, Matthew H. (ed.), Rights, Wrongs and Responsibilities, Palgrave, 2001, 247pp, $62.00 (hbk), ISBN 0333963296.

Reviewed by Matthew D. Adler, University of Pennsylvania Law School


Rights, Wrongs and Responsibilities (RWR) is an anthology of essays in legal and moral philosophy.1 The essays are generally quite impressive in rigor and sophistication, but the anthology as a whole covers a frustratingly wide array of topics. (Conference anthologies are, of course, quite often and perhaps legitimately unfocused, but in the case of RWR only three of the eight essays derive from a common conference.) Nicholas Bamforth, in “Hohfeldian Rights and Public Law,” describes the various, putatively non-Hohfeldian conceptions of “rights” employed in public law adjudication – specifically, a “right” to gain access to court to seek protection for some activity, or a defeasible “right” to engage in some activity, neither of which implies a generally enforceable duty on the part of public authorities to refrain from regulating the activity – and considers whether Hohfeldian categories are nonetheless useful in discourse about public law. Matthew Kramer, in “Getting Rights Right,” elaborates and further defends the Interest Theory of Rights that he has articulated in earlier work; in particular, Kramer considers the implications of the Interest Theory for the status of animals, infants, the comatose, the senile, and the dead as rights-holders, and clarifies whether rights, on that theory, can be unenforced or even unenforceable by the holder or others. “On Criminal Attempts,” by W.J. Waluchow, criticizes the (partly) objectivist account of the intent component of criminal attempts offered by R.A. Duff in his 1996 book, Criminal Attempts. Duff’s proposal is that “the mens rea requirement [for attempt liability] is … that the content of the agent’s intention be such that, given the context in which she forms and acts on it, she would necessarily commit an offence in carrying it out” (RRW 131). Specifically, Waluchow argues that the Duff account (1) allows that agents might be mistaken about the content of their own intentions; (2) allows that agents with identical beliefs and desires might have different intentions; and (3) is overly narrow in imposing attempt liability, since only an agent’s dominant aims, not her incidental beliefs, are included within the “content” of her intentions. Duff himself clarifies his account and responds to Waluchow’s criticisms in “Attempts, Impossibility and Intention.”

Craig Rotherham’s “Property and Justice” distinguishes between two conceptions of property (“a notion of property as pre-legal and absolute” versus “a conception of property as a social construct” (RWR 148)); delineates the differing implications of the two conceptions for a range of legal issues, for example the resources that may be the subject of property rights, entitlement to compensation for property damage, duties to trespassers, or freedom from expropriation; and ultimately argues in favor of the second conception. Richard Mullender, in “Prima Facie Rights, Rationality and the Law of Negligence,” criticizes a judicial practice whereby “publicly oriented” arguments (RWR 179) (for example, arguments sounding in the administration of justice, in concerns about bogus claims, or in the undesirable incentive effects of liability) are accepted as sufficient grounds for denying compensation to negligence plaintiffs satisfying all the elements of the traditional cause of action, and proposes an alternative doctrinal regime (involving the proportionality principle) to accommodate these “publicly oriented” concerns. Sandra Marshall’s “Noncompensatable Wrongs, or Having to Say You’re Sorry” argues that apology by the actor and not merely compensation is an essential component of the morally appropriate response to losses, not only where the losses are occasioned by the actor’s wrongdoing, but also where they are caused by his faultless conduct; and Marshall explores the role of law in producing this apology. Finally, Hillel Steiner, in “Choice and Circumstance,” argues that the best specific conception of the “equal opportunity” view of distributive justice – a view roughly and generically characterizable as one that aims at the equal distribution of welfare or welfare resources, but tolerates those deviations from equality for which the affected actors are responsible – is through a quasi-libertarian institutional structure that both gives persons transferable entitlements to objects and provides compensation, from society at large or specific actors, for losses that are not the compensated person’s responsibility.

What unifying themes, if any, are to be found in this smorgasbord? The title phrase is not particularly helpful here; each essay touches upon some aspect of “rights,” “wrongs,” or “responsibilities,” but that will be true of virtually any work in legal and, arguably, moral philosophy. The editor, in his introduction, suggests that the essays fall into “four connected pairs”: Bamforth and Kramer “reflect on the essential features of legal rights,” Waluchow and Duff debate attempts, Rotherham and Mullender “train their scrutiny on the argumentation and rhetoric of judicial … decisions in the areas of property law and tort law,” and Marshall and Steiner examine the “responsibilities owed by governmental institutions to individuals.” (RWR xi). These four pairings are plausible – although it strikes me that Marshall and Steiner have in common an interest in the responsibilities of individuals for losses, not the responsibilities of government to individuals – but one still wonders what, if anything, connects each of the four pairs with the others. One possibility is this: All eight authors examine the success of some traditional feature(s) of legal institutions in implementing some putative aspect of morality. What makes the suggested linkage quite loose is that the examined features and moral criteria are diverse. On the legal side, Bamforth, Kramer, Rotherham, Mullender and Steiner are concerned with the relational, “Hohfeldian” duties and correlative claim-rights characteristic of traditional tort and property law; Marshall, with one kind of Hohfeldian claim-right, namely the claim-right to compensation against a wrongdoer for the losses occasioned by his conduct; and Waluchow and Duff, with criminal attempt liability. On the moral side, Bamforth, Kramer, Rotherham and Mullender might each be seen as adopting, and focusing on the role of law in implementing, some moral view that is both welfarist and nonabsolutist – a moral view that in some way protects or gives moral force to “interests”, i.e., some or all aspects of the welfare of humans or other welfare-subjects, yet generally permits interests to be defeated by sufficiently weighty countervailing interests. Waluchow and Duff, by contrast, are interested in retributive justice; Marshall, in the “restitution of mutual respect” (RWR 220) as distinct from welfare generally; and Steiner, in the moral requirement of equality tempered by an appropriate recognition of personal responsibility.

As these remarks suggest, it is the quartet of Bamforth, Kramer, Rotherham and Mullender that genuinely engage a common question: namely, the success of traditional, Hohfeldian legal structures in implementing a morality that is welfarist and nonabsolutist. (This observation does not, of course, concern the quality of the remaining essays in RWR; indeed, the most rigorous argumentation occurs in these essays, plus Kramer’s). Bamforth and Rotherham are skeptical. Bamforth argues, in effect, that if P’s right can be defeated by a countervailing interest, then the right is not a genuine Hohfeldian claim-right – because genuine Hohfeldian claim-rights give rise to enforceable duties, and a “right” defeated by a countervailing interest will trigger no such duty.

The common law right to freedom of expression has been cited in numerous … cases as a factor to be weighed in the balance, rather than as a right which directly produces a duty… . Whether one prefers to describe freedom of expression as a Dworkinian principle or as a Hohfeldian privilege or liberty, it is clear that it cannot be described – despite the judicial utterances to the contrary – as a Hohfeldian right. (RWR 19-20.)

Rotherham takes a somewhat different tack: unlike Bamforth, he claims not that Hohfeldian rights are necessarily indefeasible, but rather that the particular Hohfeldian rights associated with traditional property law are.

[I]n American law tests for liability in negligence and nuisance turn in part on the social utility of the action in question … . Thus, the judiciary have been content to portray their role in terms of an accommodation of conflicting interests, rather than the enforcement of pre-existing and absolute rights. (RWR 154, emphasis added)

Rotherham further suggests that these absolute Hohfeldian rights do not best implement a nonabsolutist morality.

Neither line of argument is persuasive. As for Bamforth’s: Why insist on enforceability as a necessary component of Hohfeldian claims? P has a legal, Hohfeldian claim against Q to perform or refrain from some action just in case Q is legally obliged to Q to perform or refrain. Neither the legal cast of Hohfeldian claims, nor their relational cast, necessarily involves enforcement. As Kramer cogently explains, some legal obligations are, in fact, unenforced, and others (what he calls “nominal” legal obligations) are unenforceable.

[A] nominal legal right serves to protect one or more interests of the right-holder, insofar as the right is given effect through the heeding of it by [its] addressee(s) … (People may well choose to heed a right, of course, notwithstanding the unavailability of remedies for noncompliance.) (RWR 72).

Note that a legal claim-right defeasible by sufficiently weighty countervailing interests would be only contingently unenforceable: unenforceable just in cases where those interests obtain. Such a claim-right might be called a “prima facie legal right” which is indeed what Mullender calls it. Bamforth could try to respond by arguing that a “prima facie” Hohfeldian claim-right is incoherent, since Q owes a duty to P only if P possesses the power to enforce that duty; relationality, if not legality, entails enforceability. But this line of argument is also persuasively refuted by Kramer. It is Will Theorists, not Interest Theorists, who insist that enforceability is essential to rights. As Kramer explains, Q owes a legal duty to P (within an Interest Theory of rights) only if the duty protects one of P’s interests, if the duty is appropriately grounded in that interest,2 and even if P lacks the power to enforce the duty. To be sure, the substantive moral claim that morality is welfarist is different from the conceptual claim that the concept of “legal right” is best analyzed along Interest, not Will lines; but (at least on the plausible assumption that open-ended legal concepts such as “rights” should be construed in morally attractive ways) the moral welfarist will accept that conceptual claim.

So Hohfeldian legal structures are adaptable to a welfarist, nonabsolutist morality. First, Hohfeldian rights can be mapped onto morally significant features of the world, namely “interests.” (The Interest Theorist insists that legal rights must be mapped onto interests; at a minimum, surely, they can be thus mapped.) Second, if it is morally attractive to do so, a Hohfeldian right can be designed to more or less directly accommodate interests that outweigh the interest generating the right, specifically by making the right “prima facie”: by empowering the rights-holder or someone else to enforce the correlative duty only if such countervailing interests do not obtain (or, alternatively, if some doctrine that indirectly tests for the existence of countervailing interests, e.g., Mullender’s proportionality principle, is not satisfied). Mullender and, I take it, Kramer would concur to both of these points. What, now, of Rotherham’s suggestion that absolute Hohfeldian rights – Hohfeldian rights that are not “prima facie” in the way just described – are not the best legal mechanism for implementing a nonabsolutist morality? Rotherham, implicitly, makes the mistake of conflating moral criteria and morally justified institutions or decision-procedures, such as legal institutions and procedures. The legal regime that best implements a morality which accords defeasible weight to some interest, I, might be (1) a legal regime that accords absolute priority to I; (2) a legal regime that accords a prima facie legal right to the holders of I; or (3) a legal regime that fails to protect I. Which regime is morally best will be an empirical question. Fred Schauer, among others, has made this point in his work on “formalism.” Because the contributors to this anthology are jurisprudes, not historians, political scientists, or economists, it would be unfair to expect them to address this crucial, empirical issue. And, indeed, they do not.


1. Many thanks to Brian Bix for helpful comments. All mistakes in, and misunderstandings revealed by, this review are solely my responsibility.

2. The nature of this grounding is explored in other work by Kramer. See “Rights Without Trimmings” 78-91, in Kramer, N.E. Simmonds and Hillel Steiner, A Debate About Rights: Philosophical Enquiries (Clarendon Press 1998).