Placeholder book cover

Duncan Ivison, Rights, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2008, 288pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773533295.

Reviewed by Derrick Darby, University of Kansas







The concept of rights is arguably the most important and most frequently deployed in our philosophical lexicon of normative concepts, which includes various concepts that facilitate our evaluative interventions in ethical, political, and social matters pertaining to how we ought to live, how we ought to arrange social and political institutions, and how we ought to understand the nature of the relationship between political society and the individual. Given the relative importance and popularity of rights, numerous problems have taken center stage in the philosophy of rights but three problems loom especially large: What are rights? What is the source of rights? What are the functions of rights? Although these three problems are often treated separately or in ways that place greater emphasis on one problem, sometimes they are treated together to demonstrate how our answer to one problem bears on our answers to the others. Falling into the latter category, this book aims to shed light on connections between our various solutions to these philosophical problems.

One distinctive aspect of the book is that Duncan Ivison unifies his general project of introducing and distinguishing the different philosophical approaches to rights by taking the political character of rights seriously (6). Another distinctive aspect of the book is his endorsement of the social recognition thesis, a thesis about the source of rights, which links their existence to established social and legal practices in which ways of acting are socially or legally recognized and enforced. Although these two aspects are clearly related, Ivison's case for the political character of rights is superior to his case for the social recognition thesis. Yet by skillfully illuminating the political character of rights, and showing how the political informs particular solutions to perennial problems in the theory of rights, Ivison provides a valuable service to philosophers (like myself) who have a stake in the social recognition thesis. For it is evident that part of the motivation for this unorthodox philosophical approach to the source of rights is owed to having a deep appreciation for how the political phenomena that Ivison calls to our attention shape our various philosophical understandings of the nature, source, and functions of rights.

According to Ivison taking the political character of rights seriously involves reconciling the persistence of disagreements about how to coexist in society and how to distribute benefits and burdens -- disagreements shaped by individual passions, interests, and historical circumstances -- with the indispensable need to impose order on human relations and to keep unruly passions in check by means of coercive social and political power. So when seeking to understand the philosophical foundations of rights we must consider the role of power and various struggles for it in the face of persistent disagreement. And when considering the role of power in human relations we must consider, for instance, various norms that govern the distribution of benefits and burdens within a particular society, or as Ivison puts it, when taking power into account we must consider "rules and norms that specify how certain actions can be performed by some but not others, or that regulate the relations between men and women, the weak and the powerful, adults and children, human and non-human beings" (4-5). Taking account of these norms, which aim to legitimize social relations, is indispensable for understanding the concept of rights and the answers to questions raised by them.

Ivison forges an illuminating connection between the political and the social aspects of rights by proposing what he calls a naturalistic approach to rights (chapter 1). This approach implores us to allow empirically informed views about human nature and the world we live in -- especially views that are given to us by the social scientific study of humans and their existence as social and cultural agents -- to guide our study of rights in particular as well as our study of normative phenomena more generally. One of the payoffs Ivison claims for this approach is that it emphasizes that rights (and other political values) have to be argued for and justified. After observing that deontological and consequentialist frameworks are the most common for justifying rights, he characterizes the deontological framework as taking rights to refer to the status of individuals, purporting to capture their inherent dignity, and the consequentialist frameword as treating rights as instruments for promoting human well-being. Working through the natural law and natural rights tradition, Lockean inspired understandings of rights, property, and self-ownership, Kant's understanding of human dignity as well as contemporary versions of this view in Rawls and Habermas, and Hegel's connection between rights and mutual recognition of persons, chapters 2-5 examine how each of these approaches constitutes a different way of taking rights to refer to the status of persons. Chapter 6 is devoted to laying out the rights as instruments view; however, as this chapter is mainly an applied ethics treatment of international terrorism, it does not have the same conceptual and historical heft as the other chapters, which are more thoroughly immersed in the history of philosophy. For better balance with the chapters on rights as statuses, it would have been useful to see a similar treatment of rights as instruments, perhaps by situating this approach historically in the writings of Bentham, Mill or even Hume (whom Ivison invokes when he first introduces his naturalistic approach).

In addition to the rights as statuses and the rights as instruments views, Ivison adds what he calls the rights as conduits view, which takes rights to be vehicles for the distribution of particular powers and capacities. He develops this illuminating perspective in chapter 7, working mainly through Marx and Foucault, and for good reason I might add. Both of these thinkers have been vital sources of philosophical inspiration for persons seeking to underscore the ways in which normative ideals or concepts have been instrumental in extending existing power relations or hierarchies as well as for criticizing them. Ivison puts the point this way:

Rights are one among a number of tools that individuals and groups can use to deflect or redirect various relations of power that act on them. But they are counter-powers as opposed to inherently anti-powers; they never stand fully outside relations of power, even as they are deployed against them. (29)

Although Ivison notes that one payoff of the naturalistic approach is that it emphasizes the fact that rights have to be justified, I think the more illuminating payoff pertains to helping us see this dual function of rights both as conduits of power and as sources of protection from power, as he puts it. Philosophers who are fond of pedestrian ahistorical conceptual analysis of normative concepts have certainly appreciated the need for justifying rights claims, and they have considered various normative options for doing so. But I suspect that many of them will eschew the need to attend to the historical and practical aspects of rights discourse for these purposes. Yet by totally ignoring these aspects of rights discourse, which Ivison brings nicely into focus, we are susceptible to wrongly believing that rights can only be used for good or for humanity-affirming purposes. To be sure, they can and have been used for such purposes, but they can and have also been used in ways that raise cause for criticism, as Ivison makes clear.

I find Ivison's naturalistic approach to rights appealing but wish that he had developed and defended it more directly and systematically. As it stands, he pieces elements of it together by appealing to scattered philosophical sources of influence on his thinking, including Anthony Appiah, Bernard Williams, Carole Pateman, Charles Mills, David Hume, Amartya Sen, and Martha Nussbaum, all of whom, in different ways, appreciate the general connection between history and culture and normative concepts. I also find the thesis that rights are products of social recognition appealing. But here, too, I wish he had developed and defended his perspective more directly and systematically. I was especially curious about the ways in which adopting a naturalistic approach to rights lends support to the social recognition thesis.

Although he lays important groundwork for working this point out in chapter 5 on recognition and in the final chapter on human rights, many unanswered questions remain. To take just one: is the view that all rights -- including moral ones -- are products of social recognition or is he willing to acknowledge the existence of some moral rights prior to any form of social recognition but say that they do not have the same weight or force as fully recognized moral rights? Some of his remarks in chapter 5 make it unclear which of these two views he endorses. This in turn raises questions about where Ivison turns for normative criticism if he understands moral rights in either of these ways -- a question that is often forcefully pressed by critics of the social recognition thesis.

But setting aside these concerns, Ivison does a skillful job of showing, in broad outline, how adopting a naturalistic approach to rights allows us to revisit our understanding of core distinctions in the theory of rights (e.g., objective versus subjective rights, moral versus legal rights, interest versus will theory of rights). It also allows us to recast these distinctions so we can grasp them in new ways, allowing us to more deeply appreciate the impact that viewing ourselves as social animals with distinctive histories and cultures and taking the political seriously has had on shaping our philosophical conceptions of rights.