Rigid Designation and Theoretical Identities

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Joseph LaPorte, Rigid Designation and Theoretical Identities, Oxford University Press, 2013, 272pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609208.

Reviewed by Stephen P. Schwartz, Ithaca College


Joseph LaPorte presents an extended, penetrating, and exhaustive argument for the claim that the rigid/nonrigid distinction applies to property designators. (For convenience he lumps together terms for properties as well as general and mass terms including non-natural kind terms, and predicates under the heading "property designators" and I will mostly do the same in this review.) LaPorte examines in detail the philosophical importance of this feature of property designators and its implications for central issues in metaphysics and philosophy of mind -- in particular with respect to claims about psychophysical identity:

In this book, I articulate and defend the position that terms for properties are rigid designators. Furthermore, I argue that property designators' rigidity is put to good use in important philosophical arguments supporting and impugning certain theoretical identity statements. (p. 1)

These arguments in turn are connected to questions of essences of kinds and scientific properties.

For the last fifteen years or so LaPorte has been a prominent contributor to the literature on natural kinds, especially in light of the seminal work of Saul Kripke and Hilary Putnam in the 1970s.LaPorte has been both insightfully critical of some aspects of the Kripke/Putnam work[1] and supportive of others. His extensive knowledge of natural science makes his contributions especially valuable. This book incorporates a good deal from his previous publications while adding much that is new.

Kripke's claim that natural kind terms are rigid designators is one that LaPorte has been especially keen to defend. But natural kind terms are not special in this regard according to LaPorte. In previous publications, he has argued that many non-natural kind terms such as "bachelor," "refrigerator," and "lawyer" are rigid designators, but that other property designators are nonrigid. These arguments are refined, elaborated, and extended in this book.

The rigid/nonrigid distinction among property designators parallels the distinction for singular terms; and in fact LaPorte treats property designators as singular terms. Just as "Aristotle" is rigid and "the teacher of Alexander" is nonrigid, "the honeybee" is supposed to be rigid whereas "the biological species typically farmed for honey" is nonrigid. LaPorte plausibly claims that "the honeybee" rigidly designates the insect species Apis mellifera whereas "the biological species typically farmed for honey" designates it nonrigidly, since in other possible worlds another species than Apismellifera is typically farmed for honey. Likewise, along these lines, "white" designates the same color with respect to every possible world, whereas "the color of Antarctica" varies from world to world.

Why is the question of the rigidity of property designators including natural kind terms like "tiger," "gold," and "water" an issue at all? Kripke's claim that natural kind terms are rigid designators is murkier than his widely accepted and easily understood claim that proper names are rigid, because it is not obvious what a natural kind term is supposed to rigidly designate. The proper name "Aristotle" can be modeled as a constant function from possible worlds to individuals. It picks out or designates the same individual in every world in which he exists. But consider a natural kind term such as "tiger," which is also supposed to be rigid. It does not pick out or designate the same individuals in every possible world in which there are tigers, because different tigers exist in different possible worlds. Unlike "Aristotle" and other proper names whose extensions are constant from world to world, the extension of "tiger" varies from world to world.

If "tiger" is to be rigid, what then must it constantly designate from world to world? The most popular answer is that it designates the species or kind tiger. Thus it would be analogous to a singular term designating a concrete individual. The problem with this answer, aside from the ontologically loaded claim that the species or kind tiger is an individual thing to be designated, is that it applies to every kind and property designator, not just natural kind terms. "Bachelor" designates the same marital status from world to world, "refrigerator" the same kind of artifact, "lawyer" the same occupation, and so on. If every property designator is rigid, then the rigid/nonrigid distinction has lost its point. This issue has received a great deal of attention in the last twenty years or so because it goes to the heart of the semantics of property and kind terms and it involves complex questions about the nature of kinds, essences, and properties and our words that we use to talk about them. LaPorte argues for the view that like natural kind terms, terms such as "bachelor," "refrigerator," and "lawyer" are rigid, but that the rigid/nonrigid distinction still applies because definite-description-type designators for properties are nonrigid. According to this view, e.g., "refrigerator" is a rigid designator of a certain type of appliance, but "the type of appliance that is the largest in most American kitchens" is nonrigid because in other possible worlds Americans have monster microwave ovens in their kitchens that dwarf their refrigerators.

Among the many examples LaPorte uses to illustrate his theory one of the most interesting involves dinosaurs.The dinosaur species brontosaurus was discovered to be the same species as theapatosaurus. Thus both "brontosaurus" and "apatosaurus" are rigid and the identity "brontosaurus = apatosaurus" is necessarily true. "The largest dinosaur on a 1989 U.S. postage stamp" is nonrigid. In fact it was the brontosaurus, but might have been the tyrannosaurus -- i.e. the largest dinosaur on a 1989 U.S. postage stamp is the tyrannosaurus in other possible worlds. "'The largest dinosaur on a 1989 U.S. postage stamp' happens to designate Brontosaurus, but it does not rigidly designate Brontosaurus." (p. 23) Whereas "'Brontosaurus' which names a type of dinosaur, seems to pick out Brontosaurus rigidly." (p. 23)

This treatment seems to apply neatly as long as our ontology in this and other possible worlds contains kinds and properties that are themselves individual things. If so, LaPorte's argument is simply that this is a version of rigidity and nonrigidity for singular terms:

the rigid-nonrigid distinction carries over more or less straightforwardly from concrete-object designators to property designators, provided that property designators are all singular terms. I have been assuming for simplicity that property designators are all singular terms. (p. 64)

For those who are already happy to accept that assumption, this should be sufficient to quell doubts about rigidity for property designators. For others, Chapter 4 is devoted to arguing that all property designators are singular terms, and in Chapter 5 LaPorte demonstrates that his treatment can be applied to nominalist ontologies that do not recognize kinds and properties as entities available for singular reference. LaPorte argues that his account applies given the canonical conception of properties whereby a property is modeled as a function from possible worlds to sets of individuals. There is still an abstract object for the property designator to designate -- namely the function. LaPorte's arguments to answer the property nominalist are technical and detailed but seem sound to me given his basic presuppositions.

LaPorte is vigorous, comprehensive, and fair in replying to actual and potential criticisms of his views and arguments, and in marshaling support from other workers in the field. He discusses or at least helpfully cites virtually everything published in this area since the mid-1970s. (I should note that the usefulness of his book is enhanced by the extensive bibliography and detailed index.)

Among the many opposing views that he considers, LaPorte discusses, and rejects, an alternative view that I had proposed.[2] I claimed, perhaps a bit too glibly, that the appearance of the rigidity of property designators reflects nothing more than the fact that our words keep their meanings when we talk about counterfactual situations. Constancy of meaning is nothing interesting or exciting. When I state "If wolves had not inhabited Isle Royale, moose would have destroyed much of the native flora of the island," "wolves" means wolves, "destroyed" means destroyed, "beauty" beauty, "flora" flora, and so on. Of course words do not change their meanings when we talk about other possible worlds and LaPorte insists on this, but he argues that designation can change while meaning stays the same:

In my view 'white' is rigid, while 'the color of Antarctica' is not. But both . . . keep the same meaning when we talk about counterfactual situations. 'The color of Antarctica' is nonrigid because it designates white with respect to this world, but not with respect to some other worlds, where Antarctica is some dark color. (p. 37)

(I find this favorite example of LaPorte's somewhat awkward, since I do not comfortably think of a continent as having a color, but I will work with it.)

One difficulty with LaPorte's argument is that "the color of Antarctica" does not clearly or in all normal uses designate white with respect to this world. Consider for example its use in such an ordinary statement as "The color of Antarctica is determined by the climate conditions at the time." Here is an analogous quote from a random website: "As the seasons change, the Arctic fox changes the color of its coat." What, then, do "the color of Antarctica" and "the color of the arctic fox's coat" designate in these uses? It does not seem that they designate, rigidly or nonrigidly, specific colors such as white or brown. If we must find designations for them among the plenitude of properties, then being the color of Antarctica and being the color of the arctic fox's coat seem as good as any. A uniform treatment would suggest that every property designator rigidly designates the property it names in this fashion. This can easily seem to reduce rigidity of property designators to nothing but constancy of meaning.

I think that LaPorte would deal with this challenge by noting that property designators sometimes designate a property rigidly and at other times a different property nonrigidly depending on context and other factors, thus upholding the rigid/nonrigid distinction for property designators. Some uses of "the color of Antarctica" designate the property being the color of Antarctica rigidly and other uses of it designate the color white nonrigidly. LaPorte points out that designators for concrete individuals such as "the president of the U.S." are subject to similar ambiguities. "The president of the U.S." can be used to designate Obama nonrigidly, but also the office rigidly as in the sentence "The president of the U.S. is the Commander in Chief." If such ambiguities of concrete object designators do not impugn the rigid/nonrigid distinction for them, it ought not to impugn it for property designators. On the other hand, the lesson might be that the notion of rigidity turns out to be even murkier than we had supposed -- both for property designators and for concrete object designators. (Of course there are also many other complications. See LaPorte's excellent article on rigid designators in the online Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.)

One way of sorting out the issue of rigidity for property and kind designators that has been proposed is that a term is rigid if and only if being a member of the kind or having the property designated is essential to the individuals that are members of the kind or have the property. Since a tiger could not be anything but a tiger in any world in which it exists, "tiger" is rigid, but e.g. "lawyer" is nonrigid because no lawyer is essentially (i.e. necessarily) a lawyer. Terms that apply essentially to items in their extensions, like "tiger," are called essential appliers. One of the many virtues of LaPorte's book is that he has finally and decisively refuted the view that essential application can illuminate rigidity or anything else for that matter. The essential application theory has been touted by its proponents as enabling us to distinguish between natural kind terms and artifact kind terms. The idea is that all natural kind terms are essential appliers like "tiger," whereas artifact kind terms are not essential appliers. But surely this is wrong. I do not see how an actual refrigerator (or pencil, or TV set, etc.) could be anything else in any other possible world. Even if in a fit of rage I use my TV set for target practice, it is still a TV set -- but put to a different use. So "TV set" is an essential applier as are "pencil," "refrigerator," etc., but they are not natural kind terms. On the other hand, LaPorte points out that terms that we should consider to be rigid, such as "H2O," are not essential appliers. For example, "a quantity of water . . . loses a few sub-atomic particles in order to become non-H2O, without becoming a different quantity of matter." (p. 122) Other examples are even more obvious. If any property term is rigid, certainly "white" is, yet white objects are not essentially white. Furthermore, LaPorte insists that the essential application theory is committed to fraught and controversial metaphysical claims about essentiality and existence that serve only to unnecessarily obscure the notion of rigidity for property designators.

There is much more of value in this book than the topics I've touched on here. For example, LaPorte argues in compelling detail that we are unlikely ever to have reason to believe psychophysical identities involving rigid designators. "[W]e are not in a position to say which psychophysical identity statements are true and . . . our position will not be improved by the progress of empirical science: psychophysical identity statements, the holy grail of theoretical identity statements, are out of reach." (p. 149) "Even after scientists have told us all that they can tell us, 'pain = c-fiber firing' might for all that we know be false." (p. 213) In order to establish these claims LaPorte engages in a valuable discussion of the nature and limits of empirical science based on interesting cases such as the obsolete but oddly continuing disputes over vitalism. He offers these discussions as illustrations of the relevance of his central theses regarding the rigidity of property designators.

LaPorte's book is the definitive work on the question of the rigidity of natural kind terms and other property designators and the role that such rigidity would play in theoretical identities. Anyone who is interested in these topics, and generally in the topics of natural kinds, natural kind terms, property designation, or theoretical identities will find it a challenging, illuminating, and indispensable resource.

[1] See his "Chemical Kind Term Reference and the Discovery of Essence," NOÛS, 30: 112-132, where he questions the claim that scientists discover the essences of natural kinds, although he moves away from that criticism in the present work.

[2] See Stephen P. Schwartz, "Kinds, General Terms, and Rigidity: A Reply to LaPorte," Philosophical Studies (109), 2002.