Risk and Reason

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Sunstein, Cass, Risk and Reason, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 342pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 05217919959.

Reviewed by Kristin Shrader-Frechette, University of Notre Dame


What should be done about risks such as genetically engineered food and environmentally induced cancer? Cass Sunstein, University of Chicago chairholder and member of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, says society can respond either with “uninformed stabs in the dark” or with “cost-benefit balancing” (6). Supporting the latter, his book argues for a “cost-benefit state” controlled largely by economic experts (ix): “because I will place a high premium on technical expertise and sound science, this book is, in many ways, a plea for a large role for technocrats” (7). Sunstein’s volume is important not only because he has had a distinguished career in administrative and constitutional law (including many awards from the American Bar Association) but also because the current US presidential administration defends causal, ethical, and political claims virtually identical to those in the book. Although Sunstein correctly calls for “sound science” in risk policy, he often gets his science wrong and almost always attempts to reduce ethical to purely scientific questions.

Chapter one makes a case for environmental-risk regulation based on “reason,” on least-cost methods for saving equal numbers of lives. To determine least cost, Sunstein uses many tables listing scores of societal risks, their benefits, and their respective costs-per-life-saved. He presupposes that virtually all ethical distinctions (such as who is responsible for creating each risk, who benefits from it, whether it is compensable, or whether the risk is involuntarily imposed or voluntarily chosen) are irrelevant. For him, only cost-per-life saved should count in societal risk decisions.

Chapter two reiterates the well-known arguments that members of the public are ignorant of risk, react emotively, and fail to assess different probabilities accurately. As a result, Sunstein says, the public requires regulation when it is not supported by risk-cost-benefit balancing of the sort given in his tables (49).

To defend his “cost-benefit state,” Sunstein must show not only that members of the public are wrong about risks but also that cost-benefit experts are right. Chapter three argues that using any risk evaluations except those of cost-benefit experts amounts to using politics rather than reason (76), as he says happened at Love Canal and elsewhere: “it remains unproven that the contamination of Love Canal ever posed significant risks to anyone” (81). Dismissing many alleged risks, he says people fear things like toxic chemicals or pesticides because of “mass delusions” (79), availability heuristics (fears fanned by the media), informational and reputational “cascades,” and interest-group campaigns. Instead of faulty risk perceptions, Sunstein claims the public should rely on experts’ cost-benefit analysis (CBA) of various risks.

Chapters 5 and 6 argue for “reducing aggregate risks” (117) by testing all regulations to see whether they produce more benefits than costs (113). According to Sunstein, such cost-benefit decisionmaking does not reduce lives to dollars but actually saves lives. His reasoning is that “private expenditures on regulatory compliance may reduce risk but produce less employment and more poverty” (136); less employment and more poverty produce greater health risks because nations with higher wealth have citizens who live longer: “wealth buys longevity” (136-7); therefore, “if regulations increase poverty, and decrease wealth, they will increase risk as a result” (137). Given his causal assumption (not substantiated by any controlled experiments or statistical analyses) that regulations typically increase poverty and decrease wealth, Sunstein concludes that risk regulations typically kill more people than they save (136-137) and that the public is irrational in demanding them.

Chapter 7 defends the Bush administration’s proposed suspension of Environmental Protection Agency regulations for arsenic in drinking water. This presidential move is exactly what Sunstein recommends throughout the book: dropping regulations, including arsenic protections, that fail the CBA test, as given in his tables. Later chapters also are devoted to case studies, including one in which Sunstein challenges the Clean Air Act and argues for judicial review based on whether it passes the CBA test.

The final two chapters defend Sunstein’s alternatives to regulation: disclosure of information, economic incentives for pollution control, industry-government contracts for risk reduction and, in general, “free-market environmentalism” (132, 278). His proposals are premised on exchanging risk regulation for rational decisionmaking by technocrats. His final section is on “celebrating technocrats” (294-5).

What can be said for Sunstein’s proposals? Critics err if they dismiss his book because of its advocating CBA. And many philosophers (like Hubert Dreyfus, Doug MacLean, Alasdair MacIntyre, or Mark Sagoff) arguably miss the mark when they reject use of CBA. They err if they presuppose that (1) because CBA is not sufficient for rational societal decisionmaking, it is not necessary; (2) it is reasonable to ignore attempted calculation of relevant benefits and associated costs of proposed societal actions; (3) Ron Giere, Alex Rosenberg, and Pat Suppes are wrong in showing CBA is merely a formal calculus, capable of being interpreted in terms of any benefits and costs, even nonutilitarian ones; (4) there are reasonable ways to address the problem of social choice that ignore CBA; (5) less transparent alternatives (to analytic methods like CBA) are more susceptible to democratic control than CBA; and (6) there are no financial constraints on real-world decisionmaking. If such presuppositions about CBA err, and if many philosophers and environmentalists rely on them to dismiss CBA too crudely, what can be said about Sunstein’s position? The problem arguably is not his advocating CBA, but (A) his adopting CBA as the final or sufficient condition for all societal decisionmaking and (B) his supporting a version of CBA that requires only market parameters and willingness-to-pay criteria. (A) is flawed because CBA is only necessary, not sufficient, for policy, given the arguable need to recognize ethical and legal constraints on decisionmaking. And (B) is questionable, given that even market proponents correct for market flaws (caused by factors such as speculative instabilities, monopolies, lack of competition or full information, free goods like air and water, or public goods). Even market proponents avoid begging rights questions by using both willingness-to-accept and willingness-to-pay criteria, not just the latter, as Sunstein does. (B) also is contrary to recommendations by the World Resources Institute, many third-world economists, and experts such as Bill Schulze and Alan Kneese. But if so, Sunstein’s main problem may be not his advocating CBA , but his recommending only CBA (and only a crude interpretation of it) for societal decisionmaking.

But does Sunstein really claim CBA is sufficient for societal decisionmaking? He does say agencies are “permitted” (111) to take qualitative factors into account, presumably factors beyond the range of CBA. But his “permission” seems half-hearted, given that, in every chapter he claims one or another regulation – from requirements for child restraints (car seats) in automobiles, to workplace regulation of methylene chloride, to reduction of nitrogen oxide emissions from fossil-fuel plants – should be dropped because it does not pass the CBA “test.” To support claims about passing the test, Sunstein produces only market figures of aggregate risks, benefits, and costs for each regulation. But such figures would not be sufficient for claiming that a regulation “failed” the cost-benefit test, unless monetary values alone were sufficient for the test. Thus, although Sunstein says agencies are “permitted” to take qualitative factors into account, to the degree they do so, they undercut the conclusiveness of his CBA-test criterion for sound policy. If Sunstein’s “permission” were not disingenuous, he should have amended his claims about CBA tests and require d (not permitted) agencies to take account of qualitative factors such as legal rights to life or to equal protection, as in the Delaney prohibition against carcinogenic food additives.

Because Sunstein repeatedly calls for “sound science” to replace the allegedly irrational risk opinions of the public, what is the quality of his own science? He has no citations to work from the US National Academy of Sciences and almost no citations to mainline scientific journals to document his many claims about cancers or pollution. Instead he repeatedly cites non-scientific sources, like the American Enterprise Institute (5, 27, 138); the Reason Institute (40); political scientists Aaron Wildavsky (14, 79, 82a, 82b, 83a, 83b, 105, 135, 136) and John Graham (26, 31, 40, 49, 118, 133); and other corporate/conservative think tanks and spokespersons to “back up” most of his scientific claims.

Sunstein also seems too hasty in attacking laypersons’ irrationality and “intuitive toxicology,” while calling for risk judgments by experts. The dominant psychometric account of risk perception, that of recent Nobel Prize winner Daniel Kahneman and his coauthor Amos Tversky, fails to support Sunstein’s view. They showed that when both experts and laypeople rely on probabilities, without actual frequency data, experts are just as likely as laypeople to err in evaluating risk, even when the experts have Ph.D.s in probability or statistics and have been warned previously about the same errors. Kahneman says experts, faced with uncertain probabilities, have overconfidence and representativeness biases that are as serious as errors of laypeople. Yet Sunstein never discusses this point.

Sunstein also misrepresents rational decision theory. He argues repeatedly that expert risk decisions (based on CBA) are objective and rational, whereas lay risk decisions are delusional and emotive, yet he ignores the fact that CBA analysis of risks is deeply value-laden. It is value-laden, in part, because “risk” is an increment in “average annual fatality of probability” associated with something like workplace exposure to benzene or living near a waste dump. Because most hazardous materials are not tested, most risk probabilities are determined through mathematical models. As such, the models describe events falling into the category of Bayesian “uncertainty,” where no accurate probabilities are available, because there are no frequency data. If data were available, there would be no need for risk analysis and its attendant models. Given this Bayesian uncertainty, virtually all risk experts accept the fact that risk analyses typically err by 4 to 6 orders of magnitude. Such errors argue both against the thesis that CBA is a purely factual “sound science” (as Sunstein says) and against his claim that it is reasonable to rely only on comparative CBA of various risks (and their associated probability models), alone, in order to make societal risk policy. For example, Sunstein accuses the public of irrational fear of nuclear power. He supports the US Department of Energy (DOE) and Bush administration plan for nuclear electricity and for the Yucca Mountain (Nevada) nuclear waste facility. Yet the International Atomic Energy Agency (IAEA) used the DOE’s own radiation-dose calculations from Yucca Mountain and concluded in 2002 that uncertainty in DOE’s doses fell between 8 and 12 orders of magnitude. That is, radiation doses to the public could be between a hundred million and a trillion times higher than the DOE alleged, many times higher than what would kill everyone in the US. But the DOE did not admit this uncertainty. Both IAEA calculations – and typical risk-analysis uncertainty bands – suggest that public fear of nuclear power might not be irrational, particularly for a repository that will be lethal “in perpetuity.” 2001 DOE data also show nuclear fission is more expensive, per kilowatt-hour, than coal, natural gas, wind, and solar thermal. That is one reason no new US nuclear plants have been ordered since 1974. If nuclear energy does not pass CBA and market tests, using the best data from the pro-nuclear DOE, then why is Sunstein so dismissive of its risks throughout the book? The reader begins to suspect more than “sound science” is at work here.

Another problem with the quality of Sunstein’s research is his misrepresenting positions he attacks. For example, he claims my 1991 book, Risk and Rationality, argues (1) that risk decisions should not rely on “scientific fact” and CBA; (2) that ordinary people, not experts, should resolve risk problems; and (3) that issues of risk are “questions of value not fact” (108). Yet my book explicitly and repeatedly argues for the opposite of each of these claims. Contrary to (1), 5 of its 12 chapters criticize misuse of CBA and argue both for more and better science in CBA, and for explicit consideration of values. Contrary to (2), it explicitly and repeatedly calls for both expert analysis and public deliberation, just as did the US National Academy of Sciences’ volume, Understanding Risk, five years later. Contrary to (3), two of its chapters argue against the social-constructivist claim that risk perceptions are purely subjective/evaluative. Many environmental ethics anthologies use selections from this book to exemplify the classic position defending CBA. Hence, in saying I oppose CBA, Sunstein not only gets my position wrong, but he gets it badly wrong. Instead of attacking a straw woman, Sunstein should have answered my arguments that call for epistemological reform (not rejection) of CBA, mathematical uncertainty analyses instead of mere “best estimates,” and attention to issues such as framing and who bears the burden of proof.

Among Sunstein’s ethical presuppositions, one of the most questionable is that technocratic and lay views of risk err because the public is ignorant about probabilities. Yet as many quantitative sociologists and psychologists (Riley Dunlap, Gene Rosa, Paul Slovic) have shown, the views diverge not because of differences over probabilities, even though laypeople often get their probabilities wrong. Rather, evaluations diverge because frequently the public does not trust government risk estimates; does not believe a risk is “worth” the benefit; claims a risk imposition is unfair; or does not enjoy rights to full compensation for industry-imposed risks (as in the case of the government-mandated liability limit that excludes citizens’ claims for 98 percent of worst-case nuclear-accident losses).

Sunstein’s ignoring considerations of fairness, merit, and responsibility is particularly telling, as in his risk-CBA tables. For example, after listing various risks and their associated costs and benefits, he alleges the public is irrational in demanding money be spent to control industrial toxins in the environment, which (he says) kill 60,000 in the US each year, while not requiring government to fund programs encouraging people to exercise and eat properly (8). Sunstein neglects the fact that although people typically have rights to choose how much to exercise and what to eat, polluters do not have rights to impose their wastes on the public, just in case the societal risks (industries impose) are smaller than individual risks (like those associated with lack of exercise) chosen by citizens. Sunstein’s comparisons thus fly in the face of several hundred years of philosophical distinctions between acts of omission and commission, proximate and non-proximate causes, negative and welfare rights, justified and unjustified paternalism, causal chains of responsibility, and so on. Even the Nuremberg Accords, adopted after World War II to govern societal risk impositions, require that in medical-therapy cases, potential victims must give free informed consent to risk. Sunstein demands even less in non-therapeutic cases, the cases in which he arguably ought to require greater ethical attention.

Although Sunstein’s book offers little for philosophically sophisticated readers, it provides a fascinating glimpse of contemporary political philosophy. Bush’s philosophy of risk regulation may be defensible, but Sunstein’s arguments are too flawed to offer him much help.