Ritualized Faith: Essays on the Philosophy of Liturgy

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Terence Cuneo, Ritualized Faith: Essays on the Philosophy of Liturgy, Oxford University Press, 2016, 228pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198757757.

Reviewed by Samuel Lebens, University of Haifa


Does philosophy of religion currently deserve its name? If you examine the content pages of the most popular textbooks, or relevant undergraduate syllabuses, you'll see that the discipline often has less to do with religion than it has to do with theology. But theology doesn't exhaust religion. Religion is a tapestry of sociological, anthropological, and psychological phenomena often accompanied by a theology. If only to be worthy of its name, philosophy of religion has to have interests that go beyond the purely theological. Terence Cuneo's book is an important contribution to this task. It is a collection of Cuneo's papers on the liturgy of the Eastern Orthodox church. The chapters stand alone, but despite the odd paragraph of overlap, they also fall together quite naturally into an impressive exploration of the philosophical significance of liturgy and ritual.

The religion-centred philosophy of religion that emerges from these studies has to begin with what Cuneo calls 'thick descriptions' of actual religious practices (15). Justifying his concentration on the liturgy he knows best, he claims that:

although Howie Wettstein writes on Jewish liturgy, I find his descriptions more illuminating than general discussions of liturgy. The same is true of Wolterstorff's descriptions and interpretations of the Reformed Christian liturgies. Given the richness of their descriptions, it is easier to appreciate both points of contact with and genuine difference from them. (15)

Only when you have an actual religious practice in full view, in its rich and tradition-specific particularity, can the philosopher hope to mine it for its philosophical significance, and discuss whether the practice can be justified. If this 'thick' methodology doesn't immediately appeal to you, then the illuminating chapters of Cuneo's book, embedded in a very particular liturgical tradition, serve as eloquent advocates for it.

In the first two chapters, careful analyses of the Eastern Orthodox liturgy rub shoulders with philosophical reflection on the nature of love, the problem of evil, and the value of taking a symbolic stance -- individually or collectively. What emerges is a new conception of what liturgy in general might be able to achieve, in terms of embodying solidarity and taking a symbolic stance against evil, and why those things might be worthwhile.

In the third chapter, Cuneo explores John Schellenberg's argument from Divine Hiddenness (2007). The argument insists that if God exists, and people don't resist, and are capable of sustaining meaningful relationships with God, then God should be available to them for the purposes of a meaningful and conscious relationship. Cueno argues that Schellenberg is basing his argument on a number of assumptions about what would make love admirable. Crudely put, if God's love for us were of an admirable variety, he wouldn't hide himself, or his true identity, from non-resisters. Cuneo is right to put pressure on this assumption. There do seem to be cases in which a person can be motivated to hide their true identity from the recipient of their admirable love. Cuneo claims that God may well have such reasons to hide his true identity from us, even as he enters into meaningful relationships with us.

Cuneo claims that it is a Christian belief that God Himself is manifest to us through beauty and goodness. This marks an important distinction between God and other beings. A beautiful piece of music can remind me of the beauty and goodness of your character. The music doesn't present me, directly, with your beauty and your goodness. God is different. The music -- any beautiful music -- is, 'in fact a manifestation of God's goodness and beauty; it is a way in which God discloses God's goodness and beauty to us' (63).

Once you deny that God has to enter into a conscious relationship with non-resisters, the Christian is able to claim that God enters into meaningful relationships with human seekers, even though it isn't always evident to them that this is the case. It turns out that this might provide another function for the liturgy. When a person is drawn to the beauty of the Eastern Orthodox church services, it's possible that one is 'being drawn to God in such a way that their connection with this beauty can and sometimes does form the basis of a meaningful relationship with God' (63). That this can also provide a theological function for ballet turns out to be beside the point!

When religious people re-enact scenes of their religious narratives, what are they seeking to achieve -- and what do they achieve? This is the subject of Cuneo's fourth chapter. Cuneo calls the process, liturgical re-enactment, and documents the central role that it plays in the life of the Eastern Orthodox Church. On one extreme, you might think that religious devotees are trying, through re-enactment:

to enter into a different time frame -- so called sacred time -- in which these events originally occurred. Moreover, when they so enter, they understand their performance of these ritual events to actualise the events they appear to be re-enacting (70-1).

This was the influential theory of Mircea Eliade. Cuneo follows Nicholas Wolterstorff (1990) in rejecting it for two main reasons. One is that it is metaphysically fantastical. I find that difficult to swallow, given the other metaphysical claims that Orthodoxy makes of its liturgy, especially regarding transubstantiation.

Furthermore, if God exists and has a certain power over time, why shouldn't this sort of thing be a metaphysical possibility, and why shouldn't the world turn out to be a more fantastical place than we might have imagined?

Cuneo also rejects the model because it neglects the fact that Christianity views its central narrative as a history that actually occurred in natural time, rather than in some sacred time to which we can return through ritual. I'm not convinced. Eliade (1971) himself argued that the Hebrew Prophets basically invented the notion of linear time, in which history progresses, and there by shattered the myth of the eternal return. He was aware of that fact. But Eliade may have also sensed that the desire to transcend one's own time, and join with one's ancestors in a mystical sacred time, runs very deep in the human religious psyche. This at least adds weight to the idea that religious ritual aims at such a feat, even if religious doctrine tells us that no such feat is possible!

The other extreme relates to liturgical re-enactment simply as role-play. But in role-play one is able, so to speak, to switch oneself off; like a method actor playing a role, and completely forgetting about her own personality, and personal history. Is that really what religion is calling upon us to do, in our liturgy? Not to be present? Here Cuneo comes to the rescue of the role-play model, morphing it into what he calls the 'immersion model'. The idea isn't that you merely play a role (what he calls a pretense role), but that you play a target role (78). When you play a target role, you play a part 'of being some way for the purpose of being that way, becoming like or identifying with that which one imitates.' The distinction is reminiscent of Elisabeth Camp's (2009) distinction between pretending to be Ana Karenina, and seeing herself, metaphorically, as an Ana Karenina. In the latter exercise, one doesn't, so to speak, switch oneself off.

In chapter five, careful analysis of liturgical re-enactment in the Eastern tradition rubs shoulders with contemporary philosophy of literature -- centrally involving Martha Nussbaum's (1990) work on the purposes served by narrative engagement. Cuneo argues that liturgical re-enactment goes further than narrative engagement because liturgical re-enactment aims to contribute to the construction of your 'narrative identity'. While narrative engagement can be morally transformational, liturgical re-enactment explicitly calls upon you to commit yourself to certain goals and ideals, and asks you to reconfigure your own conception of yourself.

In chapter six, Cueno gives a truly fascinating and illuminating account of the sanctity and religious function of icons and church art in the Eastern tradition. The basic philosophical move is to appeal to the way in which God is thought to speak through the words of Scripture, even when those words were penned by human beings. The explanation of this phenomenon that most appeals to Cuneo stems from Wolsterstorff's (1995) account of Divine Discourse with its notion of 'double-agency discourse'. Paraphrased into a slogan, Cuneo's idea is that if humanly authored text can serve as vehicle for God's speech, then why can't humanly created icons and art?

When the church came to canonise a piece of scripture, the Christian will say that God came to appropriate that text -- making it his own -- and thereby making it a vehicle for his speaking to us. When the Church commissions a work of visual art, why can't the same process be thought to take hold? As an Orthodox Jew, I come from a tradition that is strongly opposed to religious iconography. Cuneo, in this chapter, gives my religious tradition -- and any other tradition opposed to such iconography -- a serious philosophical challenge to articulate a cogent opposition.

In chapter seven, Cuneo returns to the work of Nussbaum. He is interested in what makes the form of an artwork apt or inapt for its content. Cuneo comes back to this theme in chapter eleven, to great effect. But I found the conclusions of chapter seven, which focuses on the significance of setting liturgy to music, to be uncharacteristically pedestrian. Basing himself on fascinating empirical research, and his thoughts about aptness, Cuneo basically ends up saying that collectively singing the liturgy together makes us feel a sense of unity that is particularly apt for the liturgy, given its concern for the promotion of a certain sort of peace. This seemed like a lot of work to go to in order to establish something that's relatively intuitive and unsurprising.

Chapter eight was a return to form. It develops a conception of knowledge of God which is more like a species of know-how than a species of propositional knowledge. Through a life of ritual, Cuneo argues, a person might well learn how to engage God. This fascinating conclusion lays the ground, once again, for chapter eleven -- to which we'll return -- as it opens the possibility for an agnostic, nevertheless to attain knowledge of God. Chapters nine and ten develop new readings of the Eastern baptismal rites, and of the nature of sin and the 'remission of sin.'

In many ways, chapter eleven is the tour de force of the entire work, and its natural culmination. The chapter adopts a radical shift in style, taking us away from academic philosophical treatise, and into the realm of a deeply personal religious confession. And yet, one feels much better equipped to read this confession after the tutelage of the previous ten chapters.

Taking us back to the theme of chapter seven, but this time to a much more startling conclusion, Cuneo describes the aptness of the ritual as the main motivating force for his conversion to Eastern Orthodoxy. Building then upon the foundations laid in chapter eight, and before that in chapter three, Cuneo reveals that he isn't comfortable saying that he believes in the central doctrines of the Church. This doesn't matter to him. He doesn't deny them. In fact, he finds them to be generally plausible. But his unbelief is compatible, nonetheless, with his potentially knowing God and his being in a meaningful relationship with him. In eloquent testimony to the sort of non-doxastic account of faith that's championed by Daniel Howard-Snyder (2013), Cuneo reveals himself to his reader -- in deeply personal terms -- as man of deep and abiding faith, irrespective of what he believes.

Ritualized Faith opens the door to a refreshing new way of practicing the philosophy of religion. Philosophical theology, philosophy of literature, epistemology, and the philosophy of language all rub shoulders in this book -- but they do so in a profound and sustained conversation, not with religious or theological doctrine per se, but with the religious life, as it is embodied and practiced by its devotees. The fruits of this labour are too numerous to note. Perhaps my favourite take-homes were the rich variety of concepts that Cuneo develops in order to track the rich variety of imaginative engagement that the ritual life calls for (such as his notion of a target role). A religiously-centred philosophy of religion, it turns out, needs to pay a great deal of attention to the imagination, and Cuneo makes a more than promising start.

The book is not without faults. Sometimes Cuneo is aware of them. He ends the ninth chapter with a discussion of what his account of baptism has failed to answer. I have already noted that the seventh chapter seemed to arrive at a less significant conclusion than other chapters. Moved, and impressed, though I was by chapter eleven, I was left wondering whether aptness and non-doxastic faith are enough to bind a person to the authority of a church's ethical teaching, say, when they run out of kilter with one's own ethical intuitions?

Some of my worries were more general. The notion of a 'thick' philosophy of religion is refreshing and rewarding, but comes along with concerns of its own. When Cuneo gives a philosophical interpretation of a ritual, is he describing what the devotees are actually doing, what they should be doing, what they think they're doing (in which case, Eliade might have been given too short a shrift in chapter four), or what they should think they're doing?

When Cuneo talks of the liturgy calling for something -- on whose behalf is he speaking? Is he speaking for the authors of the liturgy, and their intent? On behalf of the church? Is he telling us how he personally relates to the liturgy's demands on him? Is it even possible to give a philosophical account of any one religious ritual that explains its significance for all of its devotees? Is that the goal? Or, is there some other goal?

Cuneo's project is one that I deeply sympathise with. If this exciting new chapter in the philosophy of religion is to take shape, these are some of the methodological questions that we might need to address. Nevertheless, I hope that this engaging and illuminating book will be widely read and widely discussed.


Camp, Elisabeth. 2009. "Two Varieties of Literary Imagination: Metaphor, Fiction, and Thought Experiment." Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 33: 107-130.

Eliade, Mircea. 1971. The Myth of the Eternal Return: Or, Cosmos and History. Princeton University Press.

Howard-Snyder, Daniel. 2013. "Propositional Faith: What it is and what it is not." American Philosophical Quarterly. 50(4): 357-372.

Nussbaum, Martha. 1990. Love's Knowledge. Oxford University Press.

Schellenberg, John. 2007. The Wisdom to Doubt: A Justification of Religious Skepticism. Cornell University Press.

Wolterstorff, Nicholas. 1990. "Remembrance of Thing (Not) Past." In Thomas Flint, ed., Christian Philosophy. University of Notre Dame Press: 118-61.

Wolterstorff, Nicholas. 1995. Divine Discourse. Cambridge University Press.