Roads to Reference: An Essay on Reference Fixing in Natural Language

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Mario Gómez-Torrente, Roads to Reference: An Essay on Reference Fixing in Natural Language, Oxford University Press, 2019, 233pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198846277.

Reviewed by Manuel García-Carpintero, University of Barcelona


This book is a masterful treatment of its topic. In Kripke's terminology, the topic is reference-fixing, for a representative class of referential expressions: indexicals, proper names, Arabic numerals, kind-terms, and terms for sensible qualities like colors. Elaborating on Kripke's ideas, Kaplan and Stalnaker articulated a distinction between semantics and metasemantics, ascribing complementary roles to each: to the former category belong theories that assign meanings to their bearers, prominent among them linguistic expressions; to the latter, theories that provide "the basis" for ascribing such meanings (Kaplan 1989, 573-4) or state "what the facts are" that confer these meanings on their bearers (Stalnaker 1997, 535). This is a metaphysical undertaking, concerning the grounding of meaning-facts; i.e., what determines, fixes or constitutes them. When referents for expressions like those just mentioned are understood as meaning-features thereof, reference-fixing is a part of it.

The terminology for this undertaking is recent, but the concern itself has a long history; classical work in the analytic tradition since Frege, e.g., Grice, Quine, Austin, Davidson, squarely fits into it.[1] Now, as Mario Gómez-Torrente notes (69-70), the semantic/metasemantic distinction is usually invoked to consign to "mere" metasemantics descriptive content that, on intuitive and theoretical grounds, plays a significant role in reference-determination. The two undertakings are complementary; to theorize about the metasemantics of certain expressions presupposes assumptions about their semantics, and also vice versa. Kripke's work has of course been instrumental in convincing many of us that the referent itself of a (successful) referential expression like a proper name or an indexical is "part" of its meaning. Some, however, have argued that there are descriptive conditions that are an additional "part" thereof.[2] Gómez-Torrente's take on this is nuanced. Here as elsewhere he follows Kripke, clearly his strongest influence in this work, which reads as a sophisticated elaboration of Kripkean views, departing from them when required to preserve the core in the face of serious criticism (as in the case of natural kind terms), and on the few occasions in which the author seriously disagrees with them (as in the case of Arabic numerals).

Gómez-Torrente's main claims thus echo Kripkean themes. The first allows that reference-fixing might be descriptive in some cases but insists that descriptive conditions "need not be integrated into the semantic structure of the expressions" (9). Gómez-Torrente grants that some "reference-fixing descriptive senses" (8) involving "weak and trivial" (17) descriptive features operate in some cases; say, one to the effect that the referent of a given token of 'he' is male, one of 'that' was somehow "demonstrated", or one of 'Alex' is called Alex.[3] Even so, "descriptivism does not provide the right picture of typical cases" (214). A second contention elaborates on "Kripke's evident but practically unargued skepticism about the possibility of providing a theory of necessary and sufficient conditions for reference" (214). Gómez-Torrente's claim here is that the theories he opposes don't acknowledge "the indeterminacies they should have, not that they are completely determinate or that they have some bad feature due to indeterminacy in general" (45). A final Kripkean line he pursues concerns related epistemic and ontological matters. It assumes a plausible form of a Charity Principle (not identified as such):

the natural view that truth (and falsehood) are pervasive in our languages and that our languages are thus not plagued by widespread failures of reference. A view of reference fixing congenial with this natural conception must thus provide a picture consistent with the possibility that our linguistic and epistemic capacities and dispositions do determine referents for most terms in important areas of our languages. (216)

This holds back the anti-descriptivism in the first theme. For predicative expressions whose reference depends on properties they pick out, he contends that "the typical speaker's conception" thereof helps to identify them: "the principles or preconceptions that we may see as constitutive of this conception constrain the nature of the entities . . . via some implicit reference-fixing intention" (130). Although such preconceptions "are not perforce constitutive of the meaning of the relevant expressions" (131), in the case of natural kind terms like 'gold' his account assumes "an a priori connection" with the description "the substance of which all or most of these are examples, and thus an a priori connection between 'gold' and the concept of substance" (166). These may illustrate those "other aspects of meaning that go beyond reference in the sense of truth-conditional contribution" (18) that Gómez-Torrente's overall theoretical outlook allows, as indicated above.

Recent metasemantic debates oppose intentionalist and conventionalist views; famously, Kaplan initially defended a version of the latter for demonstratives, moving later to the former. Gómez-Torrente's take combines both, along lines assumed by Kripke in formulating his Grice-inspired distinction between semantic and speaker's reference. Intentionalist features show up first in that reference-fixing conventions for given expression-types might defer to the intentions with which they are used. A second intentionalist aspect that Gómez-Torrente emphasizes is an accessibility constraint (58):

we don't need to postulate that the conventions we will state are known in the full sense by competent speakers . . . but it is reasonable to attempt to formulate conventions whose implicit familiarity to normal speakers is manifested in appropriate linguistic behaviors, behaviors that can be seen as manifesting observance of the conventions, and that don't require the deployment of abilities that it is not sensible to attribute to a normal speaker. (49)

Gómez-Torrente's objection to alternative reference-fixing theories (that they do not identify real indeterminacies) plays out in different ways for the case of expressions he takes to refer to individuals (like indexicals and proper names) and those he takes instead to refer primarily to properties (the other three he investigates) "in the way characteristic of predicative expressions" (18). In the former case, he argues that "the reference-fixing conventions . . . do not amount to necessary and sufficient conditions for reference, but only to a list of roughly sufficient conditions for reference and reference failure to take place in selected situations" (11). He considers, for instance, different proposals about cases of conflicting intentions, such as the famous picture of Carnap/Agnew example discussed by Kaplan and many others after him. He argues that they are wrong in providing a definite decision, be it a referent, or one of reference failure. This is the basis for his proposal, on which, as indicated, reference-fixing conventions provide only sufficient conditions for reference and reference-failure, and hence may remain silent in such cases. Here are two, to give the reader a flavor of the view (51-2):

Successful demonstrative reference via non-conflictive perceptual referential intentions. If a speaker S forms the intention of using a demonstrative D to refer to an object as purportedly perceived by S, and the perception in question is in fact of a certain object o, then S's use of D will refer to o, if S forms no intention of using D to refer to a different object p as purportedly perceived by S, with the perception in question being in fact of p.

Unsuccessful demonstrative reference via perceptual referential intentions. If a speaker S forms the intention of using a demonstrative D to refer to an object as purportedly perceived by S, and the purported perception in question is not of any object, then S's use of D will not refer to anything, if S forms no intention conflicting with that intention.

Gómez-Torrente articulates two more pairs of rules like this for indexicals involving descriptive and memory-based reference-fixing, without aiming to be exhaustive. Similar sufficient conditions for reference and reference-failure are stated in chapter 3 for (explicit or merely implicit) name-introduction and transmission, with similar indeterminacy motivations.

Gómez-Torrente is of course aware that many other views in the current literature highlight the underdetermination of semantic content, including in particular the (more or less radical) "contextualist" views promoted over the years by, e.g., Bach, Neale, and Schiffer. But the charity considerations in the third Kripkean theme above distance him from such views.[4] I have a concern however: proponents of these views take semantic contents to be something like Kaplan's characters. But we need to define characters, and this requires a well-supported view on what contents they determine relative to utterance contexts. Thus, there are well-known examples of indexicals that seem to contribute properties rather than objects to what is communicated. Why are these cases irrelevant to the semantic content of the relevant sentences, if indeed they are?[5] Answering such questions appears to require more definite views on the semantic contents of utterances than those views allow.

The three chapters on expressions Gómez-Torrente takes to refer primarily ("in the characteristic manner of such expressions") to properties are very illuminating. The one on Arabic numerals leans more on anti-descriptivism than indeterminacy. It offers compelling arguments against descriptivist accounts which I had found otherwise convincing. Indeterminacy issues return in the chapters on kind-terms and colors, but they go beyond the proposals in the earlier chapters that reference-fixing conventions provide only sufficient conditions for reference and reference-failure, leaving many cases undecided. In the chapter on terms for kinds, Gómez-Torrente provides a defense of the "Kripke-Putnam orthodoxy" that can resist previously raised objections. He gives special significance to arbitrariness objections, which point out that the reference-fixing mechanisms envisaged by the orthodoxy don't appear to determinately pick out one among different kinds identified by scientists; for instance, spin-isomers or isotopic variations of H2O for 'water'. A related unity objection asks why 'water' should not then be treated as 'jade' in the orthodoxy -- to wit, as perhaps referring at most to a non-natural "manifest kind" identified just by superficial features.

As Gómez-Torrente suggests (175), these objections evoke the "Problem of the Many" for expressions like 'Kilimanjaro', if taken to pick out precise atom-constituted mountains. Just consider an atom at a candidate boundary for the mountain, and two aggregates respectively including and excluding it. A (not particularly popular) solution takes such expressions (in fact, most singular terms, for similar issues are easily shown to arise generally) to refer to vague objects.[6] Gómez-Torrente defends a version of this sort of view for kind-referring terms. According to him, they refer to ordinary kinds, which

need not be ontologically composed out of other kinds, and may well be sui generis kinds -- even if the nature of some ordinary kinds may be such that membership in them turns out to involve possession of some necessary but typically non-sufficient structural scientific condition. (178)[7]

A related view is advanced in the chapter on sensible qualities like colors. Here Gómez-Torrente aims to buttress "Kripke's objectivist intuitions", arguing that "color nouns and adjectives refer to properties that are not metaphysically constituted by perceptual relations between objects and perceiving subjects, and which yield reasonable extensions for them" (185). A (to my mind decisive) objection to current views along such lines is posed by true blue (and yellow, red and green), i.e., blue without any tinge of green or yellow in it. Given the well-established fact that different subjects, at different times in their lives, locate such colors in different positions on the spectrum, extant non-eliminativist objectivist views are forced to adopt a position analogous to epistemicism in the philosophy of vagueness: of two subjects who disagree in applying 'true blue' to conditions of the same objective nature by the objectivist standards (reflectance profile, or what have you), at most one is right; but there is no way of telling who. Gómez-Torrente has the good sense to reject views of this sort (193-4), on grounds (I take it) of their metasemantic implausibility, standardly deployed against them.[8] His own proposal relies on the view on kinds just discussed: terms for sensible properties like colors refer (in context) to sui generis properties

that ascribe to stimuli the possession of values in appropriate intervals in the chromatic dimensions, especially that of hue. These dimensions are again not exactly identifiable with dimensions describable in extremely precise terms of fundamental physics, but correspond to physical dimensions and are fully objective. (218)

On this view, the two subjects envisaged above are in different contexts, and both can be right.

I hope this summary shows why this book is mandatory reading for anybody interested in its topic -- one at the heart of many current philosophical debates, not just in the philosophy of language, but also in epistemology, metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. I'll conclude by briefly putting forward a few critical considerations.

The first is relatively minor. There is a well-known debate in the semantics of names between those who take the relevant expressions to be generic and those who take them to be specific names -- Francis Bacon the 20th-century artist and Francis Bacon the Elizabethan philosopher share the former, but their specific names are mere homonyms. Predicativists like Bach and Burge and indexicalists like Recanati take the core semantics of names to be for generic ones, while Kaplan, Kripke and many others take it to be for specific ones.[9] In an uncharacteristically confusing paragraph (91-2), Gómez-Torrente appears (also uncharacteristically) to depart from Kripke in taking the former option. For he says that "the conventions for names as we will state them will be conventions about the reference of name types" and that "Virtually every name type (in the sense of syntactic expression type) is conventionally used to refer to different things". The reason he offers for this decision is that conventions should be articulated for types, not for tokens, even for words that are generally acknowledged to be homonyms with different "acceptations". But this reasoning overlooks the point that both generic and specific names are types with their particular tokens; it is just that they are individuated differently, the former phonologically, the latter historically. More in general, homonyms are distinct word-types.[10]

In any case, the reader needs to assume that the reference-fixing conventions that Gómez-Torrente provides for names apply to specific names (acceptations, in his terminology), in truly Kripkean fashion; otherwise they don't deliver the right results. They include conditions such as "S forms the (explicit or implicit) intention of using N as is used by the community of users of N and forms no intention conflicting with this" (93). Conditions like this are crucially used to deal with Evans's 'Madagascar' issues. Thus, (the imaginary) Marco Polo's uses don't clearly refer, because he "forms beliefs at the transmission stage that on the whole conflict with the beliefs of the community of users of the name at large; he forms the belief that Madagascar is "this island" that he knows" (99). At a later stage when sufficiently many others use the name for the island, conflicts fade away and the name comes to refer to the island (ibid.). Obviously, this claim cannot be sustained if it is to be evaluated across "acceptations", for 'Madagascar' might have others in the relevant idiolects, delivering spurious conflicts.

This point may be relatively minor, but it would be important in order to articulate the sort of descriptivism for names I have been arguing for -- a form of "causal descriptivism" -- and to show how it can withstand Gómez-Torrente's criticisms here. Gómez-Torrente's objections to those theories combine the two lines mentioned above. On the one hand, he contends, they don't allow for the amount of indeterminacy that can be observed. On the other, they rely on reference-fixing conditions too sophisticated to be known by ordinary speakers.

In reply, readers might first be tempted to make a tu quoque point. As has been pointed out, the metasemantics of context-dependent expressions is particularly problematic when it comes to what Neale (2016) calls "aphonics" -- expressions not phonologically articulated that many semanticists, Gómez-Torrente included, posit to contextually indicate truth-conditional determinants like degrees in scales for gradable adjectives, domain-restrictions for modals and quantifiers, and so on. Readers might be excused for finding the line dividing reference-fixing theories that Gómez-Torrente declares not accessible to ordinary speakers, on the one hand, and his own, on the other, to be hair-splitting -- especially those for context-dependent gradable expressions like the one that he posits here for sensible qualities.[11]

My own favored line of response takes a more theoretical turn. I find that both Kripke and Gómez-Torrente following him assume a too strongly Gricean, intentionalist view of metasemantics, in spite of their heavy reliance on the rhetoric of "conventions". As said above, I share, and have learned much from, Gómez-Torrente's spirited rebuttal of skeptical views on natural kinds. I would insist however that there are also social kinds, including social institutions and practices. I believe we should think of speech acts (including linguistic reference; as Searle suggested, an ancillary one) along such Austinian lines, as language-games defined by constitutive rules. To be answerable to norms we must somehow be aware of them, of sanctions when they are violated and approval when they are followed; but we shouldn't be required to be more able to articulate them than, say, the norms characterizing the specific nature of many of the traditional social institutions in which we participate.[12]

The final critical comment I would make concerns Gómez-Torrente's alleged objectivism about colors; Gómez-Torrente understandably worries about it (206-7, 211), but I am not satisfied by what he says in response. He argues that, in the case of 'jade', "the establishment of the use of calling jadeite and nephrite "jade" just amounts to the consolidation of a new, disjunctive non-natural-kind meaning of the word" (182). He queries why it is otherwise with 'water', given the facts adumbrated by critics:

is there a single ordinary substance that is exemplified by the items in a typical paradigm sample for "water"?

That the answer is "yes" can be argued in two steps. Scientific facts will play a role in the first step. They will determine that the members of the paradigm sample for "water" share a homogeneous nature. In order for this to happen, it is not required that the scientific facts reveal by themselves an identification of water in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. It is enough that the members of the sample will be revealed to share some necessary properties at the appropriate level. In the case of water, these may include being composed of H₂O, being composed of P₂O and being composed of ¾ orthowater, ¼ parawater. In the second step, the meaning of "substance" involved in the relevant referential intention will operate in order to "abstract away" a single ordinary, irreducible kind from the precise structural scientific kinds underlain in the paradigm sample. This will happen because in virtue of the ordinary notion of substance, the things exemplifying a substance will be the things which are not too different, in a suitably vague sense, from the paradigms as regards the necessary properties of the latter . . . A single ordinary kind will be referred to, because there are not two kinds satisfying the requisite that what exemplifies them are the things which are not too different, in a suitably vague sense, from the paradigms as regards the necessary properties of the latter. (179)

Applying this methodology, the worry about sensible qualities is this: do the scientific facts about the properties picked out on each occasion of use by 'true blue' make it closer to 'water', or to 'jade' instead? What would be the result of applying the suggested two-tiered methodology to all cases that competent speakers, in different contexts, competently find it appropriate to apply 'true blue'? To me, they clearly favor the subjectivist view that the relevant kind is just constituted by dispositions to produce experiences of certain types.[13]


Financial support for my work was provided by the DGI, Spanish Government, research projects FFI2016-80588-R and FFI2016-81858-REDC, the award ICREA Academia for excellence in research, 2018, funded by the Generalitat de Catalunya. Thanks to Mario Gómez-Torrente, J. P. Grodniewicz, and Matheus Valente for comments on a previous version, and to Michael Maudsley for his grammatical revision.


García-Carpintero, Manuel (2000): "A Presuppositional Account of Reference-Fixing," Journal of Philosophy xcvii (3), 109-147.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2007): "A Non-Modal Conception of Secondary Properties", Philosophical Papers (Rep. Sudáfrica), 36 (1), 1-36.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2012): "Foundational Semantics, I & II", Philosophy Compass 7(6), 397-421.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (2018): "The Mill-Frege Theory of Proper Names", Mind 127 (508), 1107-1168.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (forthcoming-a): "Metasemantics: A Normative Perspective (and the Case of Mood)", P. Stalmaszczyk (ed.), The Cambridge Handbook of the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge University Press.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (forthcoming-b): "Reference-fixing and Presuppositions", in S. Biggs & H. Geirsson (eds.), Routledge Handbook on Linguistic Reference.

García-Carpintero, Manuel (forthcoming-c): "Models as Hypostatizations", in Alejandro Cassini & Juan Redmond (eds.): Models and Idealizations in Science: Fictional and Artifactual Approaches, Springer.

Gómez-Torrente, Mario (forthcoming): "The Sorites, Content Fixing, and the Roots of Paradox", in O. Bueno and A. Abasnezhad (eds.), On the Sorites Paradox, Springer.

Kaplan, David (1989): "Afterthoughts", in J. Almog, J. Perry and H. Wettstein (eds.), Themes from Kaplan, Oxford University Press, 565-614.

Neale, Stephen (2016): "Silent Reference", in Meaning and Other Things, G. Ostertag (ed.), Oxford UP, 229-342.

Stalnaker, Robert (1997): "Reference and Necessity," in C. Wright & B. Hale (eds.), A Companion to the Philosophy of Language, Blackwell, 534-554.

[1] Cf. García-Carpintero (forthcoming-a). I'll limit references to works in which fuller updated information can be found. I indulge in a preference for some of my own work, because it contains details and elaborations of the points I make here.

[2] I have argued that token-expressions (or "expressions-in-context") -- the devices of reference for indexicals, proper names and kind- and color-terms -- trigger reference-fixing presuppositions (not-at-issue contents) as part of their linguistic meaning (García-Carpintero 2000, 2018).

[3] Such propositions are identified as "not-at-issue" semantically triggered presuppositions in the accounts mentioned in the previous footnote; cf. García-Carpintero (forthcoming-b).

[4] See Gómez-Torrente's (forthcoming, §4).

[5] García-Carpintero (forthcoming-a) elaborates on the point.

[6] I have defended the unpopular view in several papers, arguing that a version of supervaluationism -- the theory of vagueness I favor -- can adequately deal with concerns about vague objects; cf. García-Carpintero (forthcoming-c) for discussion and further references.

[7] Gómez-Torrente doesn't discuss vagueness in the book, but has a well-argued original position on the topic; cf. Gómez-Torrente (forthcoming) for a recent presentation. I assume he thinks the view can deflate ontological concerns about the sui generis kinds he posits, and about the vague propositions I equally assume the account then needs.

[8] García-Carpintero (forthcoming-a) develops the objection.

[9] García-Carpintero (2018) discusses the issue and provides further references.

[10] See the discussion in García-Carpintero (2018).

[11] Gómez-Torrente's declaration about truly complex reference-fixing "conventions" mentioning occasions of use and intended indeterminate standards in scales for the colour dimensions of hue, saturation and brightness struck me as amusing. He "takes it to be clear" that they "can be plausibly said to be accessible to normal competent speakers" (197, 198). Surely not to my 9-year-old daughter, an otherwise quite normal competent user of 'hot' and 'red', nor to most of my friends for that matter. One may think that his "accessibility" constraint is meant to be very weak. But this fits badly with Gómez-Torrente's favourite objection to rival theories that they don't meet it (see, e.g., 17, 46, 80, 118, 157, 195).

[12] García-Carpintero (forthcoming-a, forthcoming-b) develops the point.

[13] Gómez-Torrente objects to this sort of view on the basis of Kripkean intuitions (192-3); but García-Carpintero (2007) argues that it should be understood as a revisionary one, hence unaffected by such considerations.