Robert Brandom: Analytic Pragmatist

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Bernd Prien and David P. Schweikard (eds.), Robert Brandom: Analytic Pragmatist, Ontos, 2008, 194pp., €25 (pbk), ISBN 9783938793770.

Reviewed by Bernhard Weiss, University of Cape Town


The book emerges from the 10th Münster Lectures on Philosophy held in 2006. It begins with a piece by Brandom, "Towards an Analytical Pragmatism", that is essentially the first lecture in his Locke lectures, now published as Between Saying and Doing (Oxford University Press, 2008). Brandom's paper is followed by nine critical pieces to each of which he offers a reply. Because his paper is available elsewhere the value of the volume is bound to lie primarily in the series of debates that follow it. These form something of a mixed bag both in terms of quality and topic. The range of topics appears to follow no guiding principle but includes useful attention to: the epistemological implications of Brandom's normative pragmatics, the distinction between theoretical and observable entities, success semantics, normativity and objectivity, historical discussion of Brandom's reading of Hegel and Frege (and incidentally Kant), Brandom's account of normative and modal vocabularies, and Brandom's incompatibility semantics for the notion of necessity. The essays are, in the main, brief and focus on their target rather than arguing for elaborate alternative views. So the interchanges between Brandom and his critics tend to be crisp and helpful. And that was my major impression on reading the book: it helpfully probes aspects of Brandom's view, forcing him now to clear up some unclarities, now to add some supporting commentary and now to concede a gap in the programme. So it is helpful without being massively insightful.

The first paper ("Brandom on Knowledge and Entitlement" by Sebastian Schmoranzer and Ansgar Seide) investigates the epistemological implications of Brandom's semantics. It claims that Brandom must adopt a justified, true belief account of knowledge and goes on to claim that he must also be an externalist about empirical justification. His position thus becomes prone to attack by a second order epistemic scepticism. The argument for pinning the justified, true belief account on Brandom proceeds by looking at what, according to Brandom, entitles ascription of knowledge. Here I think the authors mistakenly move from an account of such entitlements to attributing a definition of knowledge to Brandom but there's clearly no need for him to accept this; rather we simply cast illumination on the notion of knowledge by looking at what is involved in making attributions of knowledge. At any rate it wasn't clear to me just how the first part of the paper made way for the second. Here it is argued that the regress stoppers in Brandom's view are default entitlements: either free moves or noninferential reports. The former cannot simply be those moves that merely happen to be taken to be unchallengeable by the community -- this would accord them no sort of epistemic pedigree -- but must be moves which are reliable -- perhaps because they go unchallenged. Similarly noninferential reports that carry epistemic entitlement are not reports made by those who are treated as reliable but are reports made by those who are genuinely reliable. So the basis of epistemic justification will inevitably be externalist and internal justifications based thereon will inherit this external cast. The problem this is supposed to create is threefold. First Brandom's middle way between internalism and externalism collapses into a variety of externalism. Secondly, second order scepticism becomes viable: we can have no internalist reason to suppose we are reliable reporters and so no reason to suppose we are knowers. Thirdly, the distinction between default and all-things-considered entitlements vanishes. Default entitlement is distinguished through its susceptibility to challenge. But if justification is externalist then its epistemic status consists solely in its being the product of a reliable process. So it cannot be vulnerable to challenge. Brandom responds by predictably moving the question from one of what a knower is to what is involved in attributing knowledge. We can save the distinction between default and all-things-considered entitlement because the attributor may have collateral information which may bring her to alter her attributions of reliability and hence of knowledge. So the default entitlement can be overturned. Additionally, in asking whether beliefs treated as entitled by the community are genuinely reliable the authors ask a purely epistemological question which bypasses the semantic; we cannot fix on what is believed and then ask how it ought to be believed and it may well be that reliably occurring occurrences have been incorporated in those inferences universally accepted by the community. The middle way survives because pure externalism -- the claim that reasons never matter -- is rejected. Reasons do matter, in particular, the ability to cite one's own reliability as a justification frequently matters. Second order scepticism thus cannot be a threat.

The second paper ("Of μ-Mesons and Oranges: Scrutinizing Brandom's Concept of Observability" by Jochen Apel, Simone Bahrenberg, Carolin Köhne, Bernd Prien, and Christian Suhm) takes issue with Brandom's rejection of an ontological distinction between observable and theoretical entities. The point of the paper is simple enough. We need a sharp distinction between observable and theoretical entities because otherwise we cannot explain two things: (i) why it is that scientists whose supposed observations of theoretical entities are challenged revert to inferential justifications; and (ii) why it is that our mundane, folk ontology is relatively invariant whereas there is radical change in our theoretical ontology. Brandom concedes the phenomena and concedes that there is a distinction between observable and theoretical entities. The question is whether the distinction is, at base, ontological or methodological. Do the phenomena require explanation in ontological terms? Observationality is a matter of how proximally related an object is to the observer. As the causal route from object to observer is extended there become progressively more possible sources of interference. When such a distal observation is challenged, there will often be a need to justify the observation by inference about the causal route and/or to infer from more widely spread accepted observations, or to have one's observations undermined by new collateral information. Thus each phenomenon can readily be explained purely methodologically.

I found the next paper ("Successful Action and True Beliefs" by Nikola Kompa, Rudolf Owen Müllan, Bernd Prien, and David P. Schweikard) less successful, in part, because it doesn't focus on a central feature of Brandom's own views -- it defends success semantics against Brandom -- and, in part, because of the nature of the position it develops. The paper takes on itself the task of modifying Jamie Whyte's account of success semantics to withstand obvious objections. The aim is to buttress the idea that practical reason rather than the generation of incompatible commitments is the way practice confronts reality. Whyte tries to define a belief's truth condition as 'that which guarantees the fulfilment of any desire by the action which that belief and desire would combine to cause'. The thought then is that if an action based on a practical inference fails then one of the beliefs which informed the inference must be false and by co-ordinating between different such inferences we can isolate the belief to be blamed. The strategy fails because the practical inference is not monotonic; it is, in general, subject to a variety of normalcy conditions which needn't feature in the agent's beliefs. The suggested modification is to accept that the failure of the action may reflect either on the falsity of one of her beliefs or in the normalcy conditions. Whether or not the modified position works, it develops a success semantics that is unproblematic for Brandom. This is because so construed, it cannot be exploited in a definition of truth -- as the authors concede -- and, moreover, it now becomes thoroughly implausible, given the indefinite, infinite range of normalcy conditions, that the co-ordination exercise is at all feasible.

The next two papers both deal with the interesting issue of how objectivity enters Brandom's picture. The first ("Are Fundamental Discursive Norms Objective?" by Sebastian Laukötter, Bernd Prien, Till Schepelmann, and Christian Thein) questions whether the fundamental discursive norms are objective. Brandom tries to account for the objectivity of inferential norms by arguing that these might -- often do -- generate incompatible commitments. The norms are thus attitude transcendent because, although a speaker may take herself, or all speakers may take themselves, to be entitled to be inferring according to such norms, no such entitlement may be legitimate. The adequacy of the norms is thus not merely the product of speakers' attitudes. Set aside questions about the success of this tactic. The authors claim it won't transfer to an account of the objectivity of fundamental discursive norms -- norms such as the norm of justifying assertions or of not tolerating incompatibilities. The reason is that inferential norms can give rise to incompatibilities which require revision of those norms. We cannot be in such a situation with respect to the fundamental discursive norms: we cannot be forced to revise them; the notion of incompatibility gets no grip here. Brandom concedes the depth of the point and concedes too that he has no ready answer to it. What he claims is that he needs to guarantee that there is an attitude transcendence to these norms but that they are not forced on us by the way the world is: in a sense, they are optional. They are optional not because one can conceive of ways of asserting and inferring that betray these norms but because one need not go in for the business of asserting and inferring; one need not be a discursive creature. Though he doesn't use the phrase it seems that the special status accorded to these norms is that they are constitutive of discursive practice. Perhaps too then there are constitutive norms governing greeting, which have a degree of objectivity but which are optional depending on whether one is a greeting sort of creature. Would similar remarks drive us to objectify the norms of tennis, for tennis playing creatures? Certainly there is no option but to follow certain norms, if one is to play tennis. As he says, more and interesting work remains to be done here.

The second of these papers on objectivity ("Realist and Idealist Interpretations of Brandom's Account of Objectivity" by Michael Pohl, Raja Rosenhagen, and Arne M. Weber) begins by testing out two readings of Brandom's account of objectivity: a realist reading and an idealist reading. The realist reading sees Brandom as offering a transcendental argument that there is an objective world constraining our practices. The account is rejected on three grounds: it violates Brandom's semantic deflationism; it conflicts with his rejection of such a transcendental argument; and it cannot be reconciled with his view that the objective world is a product of our score-keeping practices. An idealist reading is recommended, in particular for its ability to make sense of this last point. A worry is then voiced over Brandom's ability on such an account to explain the notion of causality, which is needed in his talk of reliable differential responsive dispositions. Brandom accepts the point. He says that he would like to be able to understand reliability in terms of first and second order counter-factuals but has not developed such an account.

The following two papers focus on Brandom's reading of Hegel and Frege respectively. The paper on Hegel ("Comparing Brandom's Critical Reading and Hegel's Systematic Enterprise" by Jana Elisa Falkenroth, Attila Karakuş, and David P. Schweikard) argues that Hegel's ontological views are crucial to his system. Brandom demurs, adopting a semantic approach that is quietistic about ontology. The paper on Frege ("Brandom and Frege" by Ulrike Kleemeier and Christian Weidemann) was perhaps the most disappointing in the collection, though it raises an interesting question: is Brandom right to see the early Frege as a forerunner of inferentialism? It is important here, as Brandom explains, that we focus on the early Frege. After the introduction of the distinction between sense and reference it is no longer possible to see Frege as an inferentialist. Before that phase it is possible to see Frege as identifying a confused notion of conceptual content in terms of inferential role. That confused notion finally separates out into its distinct components -- sense and reference -- and with it dies the inferential approach in Frege's work. The question remains whether the confusions attending Frege's inferential conception of content generalise to other such conceptions.

The final two papers deal in very different ways with Brandom's views of modality and both focus on his Locke Lectures. The first ("Between Normative and Modal Vocabulary: A First Encounter with Brandom's Locke Lectures" by Bernd Prien) argues that there is a dangerous assimilation of modal to normative vocabulary in Brandom's account. Accordingly the content of modal claims can be seen as making explicit incompatibilities present in the deployment of any autonomous vocabulary. Any such practice will involve the business of keeping track of commitments and entitlements and, in particular, of cases where commitment to one claim precludes or is incompatible with entitlement to another. The question is whether we should read the claim that P is incompatible with Q in modal or normative terms. The paper argues that Brandom has only given us reason for seeing the incompatibility in a normative light, namely, that a subject ought not to be committed to both P and Q. Brandom responds by claiming that the same incompatibility can be seen both in a normative and in a modal light. If we treat the incompatibility as subject-centred -- a subject repels incompatible commitments -- we get the normative claim; if we treat the incompatibility as object-centred -- an object repels incompatible properties -- we get the modal claim. The response here seemed to miss part of the complaint. The complaint was precisely predicated on this assimilation of modal and normative vocabulary as making explicit the same incompatibilities. So it begins from the position Brandom happily describes but it finds this position worrying because it sees here a violation of the pragmatic dependence of content on use: how can different contents arise from making explicit the same aspects of use? The point is made -- unwisely in my view -- in terms of vocabularies: how can both normative and modal vocabularies -- vocabularies which have different expressive powers -- play an explicitating role with respect to the same autonomous vocabulary? Phrasing the matter in terms of vocabularies is not helpful because there is no reason why the practices involved in using a vocabulary should not be sufficient for the deployment of two distinct vocabularies: the relation of PV-sufficiency between practice and vocabulary need not be functional. The pragmatic dependence of content on use is more refined than can be captured by a relation between a vocabulary and use; it is a relation between a claim expressed by a sentence and use. So far as I can see there is no reason why Brandom should take the modal and normative claims to have the same use despite the fact that they explicitate the same incompatibilities, indeed quite the reverse.

The final paper ("How to Kripke Brandom's Notion of Necessity" by Benedikt Göcke, Martin Pleitz, and Hanno von Wulfen) takes on the technical development of Brandom's notion of necessity. As he develops it, necessity is directly explained in terms of incompatibility without the development of the apparatus of possible worlds and accessibility relations and the resulting system gives rise to S5. This troubles Brandom because he would like the incompatibility semantics to be compatible with notions of necessity incorporated in other systems such as those of S4, K, T and B. The authors offer an account which uses the notion of incompatibility to develop a Kripkean apparatus of possible worlds and accessibility relations. They claim that the resulting system does not lead directly to the systems of S4 and S5. The paper thrills Brandom but he adds the cautionary remark that his own endeavours in this direction were frustrated by developing only a degenerate modal system, one in which 'LMp®p' is valid. He would like a demonstration that this is not valid in the system presented here.