Robert Brandom

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Jeremy Wanderer, Robert Brandom, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2008, 240pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773534865.

Reviewed by Christopher Gauker, University of Cincinnati


This is a very good book. It is an intelligent, interesting, economical, unpretentious, and, as far as I can tell, accurate exposition of the main features of Robert Brandom's philosophy of language. Wanderer gets Brandom to speak for himself, without using the history of philosophy as a mouthpiece, and the voice we hear is much clearer. There are very clear expositions of the main features of Brandom's normative, social-practice-based theory of language, and Wanderer strives with integrity to defend him against the main objections. However, I think he still fails to satisfy us on the main question, namely, whether Brandom can give objectivity its due.

Brandom frequently presents himself as offering a theory of content. This is mysterious, since he does not have any of the usual uses for the concept of content. The notion of content has been employed in explaining communication (content is something shared), in the semantics of propositional attitude ascriptions (contents are what "that"-clauses refer to), in logic (where logical implication is explicated as a relation of containment between contents), and in accounts of translation. But Brandom does not put the concept of content to use in any of these ways and, on the contrary, rejects the theories that rely on it in these ways. So it is enlightening when Wanderer finds a different way to characterize Brandom's aims, not as aiming to explicate content. Wanderer does not hesitate to speak of "content" in characterizing Brandom's view, but on the whole he treats Brandom as answering a different question, about sapience: What kind of linguistic practice is distinctively sapient?

Wanderer's Brandom answers that a sapient being, unlike a parrot, participates in a language-mediated game of giving and asking for reasons. A common misunderstanding of Brandom is to interpret him as locating the essence of linguistic practice in dispositions to make inferences. Wanderer's exposition makes clear that, for Brandom, no linguistic dispositions qualify as sapience apart from their being supported by and sensitive to expectations and sanctions on the part of other members of a linguistic community. Wanderer helps us grasp what is distinctive in Brandom's philosophy of language by contrasting Brandom's conception of language as grounded in social practice with Locke's conception of mind as grounded in perception. Wanderer also helpfully stresses that Brandom is motivated in part by skepticism about word-world representation relations. Wanderer seems (pp. 32, 96) to think the problem comes down to an objection to an atomistic account of meaning. But I am not sure that Brandom has ever clearly explained which of several possible doubts about reference relations are the ones that move him, and I myself do not see that a representationalist has to be, or typically is, an atomist.

Wanderer has a very simple way of explicating the nature of language games as Brandom understands it. Wanderer compares a language to a board game in which gameplayers have "counters" that they can advance or withdraw. These counters are to be the analogues of claims. Each gameplayer is also a scorekeeper who, in that capacity, keeps track of the counters that other gameplayers must add or remove from the board as a consequence of the counters each has advanced. Part of what is involved in keeping score on another gameplayer is distinguishing between those counters to which the gameplayer is merely committed and those to which the gameplayer is in addition entitled. Entitlement to a counter is earned by advancing other counters to which one is entitled that lend entitlement to the counter in question.

As Wanderer emphasizes, one of the most important achievements Brandom claims for his conception of language is an account of the meaning of logical vocabulary. Logical vocabulary is supposed to emerge as an elaboration of a linguistic practice, and it does so by "making explicit" features of the practice from which it is elaborated (p. 59). Hence the title of Brandom's first important book: Making It Explicit (Harvard 1994). Brandom's central example is the case of conditionals. A constant refrain throughout Making It Explicit is that a conditional claim, made by means of a sentence of the form if p then q, makes explicit a feature of scorekeeping practice according to which anyone who claims that p thereby also becomes committed to claiming that q. A conditional, Brandom often says, codifies the inferential commitment to accepting that q that results from claiming that p. Wanderer treats Brandom's account of indirect discourse and knowledge claims under this same heading as well, as devices by which communicators make explicit features of prior linguistic practice.

In light of the showcase status of Brandom's theory of conditionals, it is disturbing that Brandom does not put more effort into showing that it actually passes muster as a theory of conditionals, and it is regrettable that Wanderer does not entertain any objections to it. Brandom always chooses examples in which the connection between antecedent and consequent might be described as necessary or analytic, such as "If Wulf is a mammal, then Wulf is a vertebrate," or in which the truth of the antecedent is a reliable indicator of the truth of the consequent. But many of the conditionals we utter are not at all like that, such as "If you come to the meeting, then I will see you there" or "If Smith enters the primary, then Jones will drop out of the race," which are acceptable only in virtue of ephemeral features of a given situation (such as that I too will be at the meeting) and do not seem to codify any kind of standing obligation to accept the consequent upon claiming the antecedent. In his recent book, Between Saying and Doing (Oxford 2008), Brandom presents a formally precise semantics grounded in a relation of incompatibility. Here the conditional if p then q is introduced as an abbreviation of not-(p and not-q) (p. 159). That is not what we would have expected on the basis of the account in Making It Explicit, and Brandom makes no effort there either to defend his theory as a theory of natural language conditionals.

The obvious question, which strikes every reader of Brandom very forcefully, is: What in his theory makes language more than a completely pointless game? We can see in outline how the representationalist hopes to answer this question: By means of language we share our mental maps of our world, and by means of these mental maps we successfully navigate the terrain. The crucial detail that representationalists persistently fail to provide is a clear account of the mapping relation. So we should all be very receptive to alternatives that do not posit any such relation. But what can Brandom, from the point of view of his inferentialism, say to make it intelligible that by means of language we succeed in achieving our individual and collective ends? Why is it not just arbitrary whether society favors one sort of linguistic practice over another? Much of Wanderer's exposition appears to be a struggle to find in Brandom a satisfactory answer to this question of arbitrariness.

As Wanderer notes (p. 111), but perhaps underemphasizes, integral features of Brandom's conception of the actual social practice constitutive of sapience are the proprieties of making claims in response to nonlinguistic, perceptible circumstances (language-entry moves) and the proprieties of nonlinguistically acting in response to claims (language-exit moves). Confronted with the question of arbitrariness, an obvious answer to try, which Wanderer does in fact offer on Brandom's behalf (pp. 187-192), is to say that it is these relations to perception and action that tie linguistic practice to the state of the mind-independent world. A first problem with this answer is that Brandom seems himself to undercut it with his account of what the relation consists in. The way in which nonlinguistic circumstance is supposed to license a linguistic response is not through some reliable causal connection (Brandom himself emphasizes the so-called reference class problem) but only by being the object of a scorekeeping practice that deems licensed the response (Wanderer, p. 190; Making It Explicit, p. 212), which leaves us with a question about the nonarbitrariness of that very scorekeeping practice.

A second problem is that even if we can show that the language-entry moves and language-exit moves licensed by the scorekeeping practice are adequately constrained by the nature of the mind-independent world, we are still left with nearly total freedom to say whatever we like regardless of the physical structure of our actual world. Imagine a language, call it language A, in which the only move licensed is to claim, "All is well," no matter what happens. Speaking language A will not advance our practical aims in any important way. Consider, then, a language B in which we can say "That's red" only in response to red things and can say "That's a dog" only in response to dogs, and so on. Compared to language A, language B might seem to allow a sorting of objects into kinds that could be useful. But if the only response that is permitted in response to "That's red" and "That's a dog," and so on, is to say "All is well," then language B will be no more useful than language A. In order for a language to be practically useful, the structure of the physical world must have a bearing not only on which language-entry and language-exit moves are permitted but also on which language-language moves are permitted. Brandom can of course require that the totality of our linguistic dispositions not lead us into explicit contradiction, but, beyond that, I do not see that Brandom has resources by which he can establish the relevance of the actual structure of the world to the permissibility of an inference from one claim to another.

Much of Wanderer's exposition seems to be aimed at ways of finessing the question of arbitrariness without actually appealing to the structure of the physical world, by showing that much of the theoretical vocabulary of the representationalist has a legitimate place in a language although not as a part of our fundamental theoretical account of language. An important first step is Brandom's account of the distinction between singular terms and predicates. Singular terms are expressions that occupy a grammatical position in which terms are sometimes symmetrically substitutable (one for the other), while predicates are expressions that may be only asymmetrically substitutable (as "mammal" may be substituted for "dog" in atomic predications but not conversely). Drawing this distinction is supposed to be Brandom's first step toward explaining what it is to conceive of the world as containing objects, for we conceive of objects as essentially the referents of singular terms (pp. 133-134). Brandom takes a second step by explicating the terms "true" and "refers" as devices by which interlocutors keep track of people's commitments and compare them to their own. Specifically, Brandom endorses a version of the prosentential theory of truth, which holds that "That's true" is a prosentence (as "he" is a pronoun), which interlocutors can use as a way of taking over the commitments voiced by another.

As a big third step, Brandom holds that the concept of objectivity can be explicated in terms of the practice of de re attributions of saying and belief. As Wanderer presents it, Brandom's theory of the nature of communication can also be found in his theory of de re attributions of saying and belief. Wanderer devotes most of chapter 7 to these claims, but I am afraid that I still do not understand them. That we can make de re attributions shows that we can in some sense translate another person's perspective into our own. But in making a de re belief attribution we do not also say that it is not de dicto. (Contrary to Brandom's working assumption, the de re/de dicto distinction is not syntactically marked in English.) So I do not see that de re belief attributions themselves represent the fact of a difference in perspectives. Acknowledging a disagreement does that more plainly. That we can make de re attributions of sayings may show that we can use another person's words without simply adopting them, and that this is so may help us to overcome the conception of communication as the sharing of something (a content). But I do not see that Brandom has much to say about how we do this, and so I do not see how Brandom's discussion of de re attributions can be taken as a theory of communication.

Wanderer finds in Brandom one more stab at answering the question of arbitrariness, in what he calls Brandom's "bold conjecture," which Wanderer finds in the final pages of Making It Explicit. The bold conjecture is that understanding the scorekeeping practices that sustain a language will always suffice to enable us to merge that practice into our own (p. 81). Wanderer represents this as an attempt to establish the rationality of the language game Brandom describes. But the bold conjecture could also be taken as an answer to the question of arbitrariness inasmuch as, if it were true, it would indicate a kind of inevitability or uniqueness of practice that might answer the question of arbitrariness. However, this is one path that even Wanderer cannot take. He thinks that Brandom has not shown that every practice recognizable as scorekeeping will exhibit all of those features that we regard as essential to our own.

Wanderer rightly emphasizes that for Brandom semantic theorizing has to do with norms. In closing I would like to point out that there are other ways than Brandom's to think of semantics as essentially a normative enterprise. In Brandom's conception, semantic theorizing is normative specifically in the sense that normative notions, such as commitment and entitlement, are employed in defining the concept of semantic content. A nonnormative, naturalistic conception of truth and meaning can allow that these concepts have a place in the formulation of instrumental norms (such as "If you want to achieve your goals, believe only truths!" and "If you want to be understood, let your words mean what they mean for others!"). But there might also be a distinctively unBrandomian, yet thoroughly normative conception of truth and meaning that denies that truth and meaning are naturalistically reducible relations or properties while maintaining that these concepts have a role to play in formulating discourse norms (such as, "Assert only truths!" and "Mean what others mean!"). The normativity of semantic concepts might consist, not in the fact that we use normative concepts to define them, but in the fact that we consider them to be explicable only in terms of their role in defining the norms.