Robert Nozick

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Schmidtz, David (ed.), Robert Nozick, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 240pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521006716.

Reviewed by Thomas Kelly, Harvard University


The present volume is a collection of ten previously unpublished essays on the philosophy of Robert Nozick by a distinguished group of contributors that includes Michael Bratman, Philip Pettit, and Michael Williams. While earlier collections devoted to Nozick’s work have focused either exclusively on his political philosophy or on his epistemology, this volume aspires to a critical examination of his thought as a whole. The result is a stimulating collection that will prove of value to those who are interested in Nozick’s work and in the many topics to which he made seminal contributions over the course of his career.

Despite its aspiration to engage with the full range of Nozick’s work, the collection is, nevertheless, rather heavily focused on the political philosophy developed in Nozick’s first book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1975). Four of the essays (by David Miller, John Sanders, Loren Lomasky, and Philip Pettit) are exclusively concerned with Anarchy, State, and Utopia while a fifth (by Gerald Gaus) explores the relationship between it and the theory of practical rationality put forth in Nozick’s later work The Nature of Rationality (1993). I will first provide a brief overview of the essays and then make some general remarks about the strengths and weaknesses of the collection as a whole.

The bulk of the enormous critical literature spawned by Anarchy, State, and Utopia has focused on Nozick’s claim that nothing more than a minimal state (i.e., one that is limited in its operations to enforcement of contracts, protection against force and theft, and so on) can be justified, and that any more extensive state will inevitably violate individual rights. Much less scrutiny has been given to Nozick’s argument against the individualist anarchist, who rejects even the minimal state on the grounds that it illegitimately claims a monopoly on the use of force within its borders. Nozick’s argumentative strategy against the anarchist is to show that a minimal state would arise from a pre-political state of nature by purely voluntary means. In his “The Justification of Political Authority”, David Miller attempts to cast doubt on both (i) whether this process would occur in the way envisaged by Nozick, and (ii) whether its doing so would suffice to justify the minimal state that results. Miller’s purpose is not to defend the anarchist from Nozick’s attack but rather to clarify what is required (and, more directly, what is not required) to justify political authority. He argues, plausibly, that in “attempting to provide a justification for the state that would be compelling even to those intuitively most skeptical of its claims…Nozick sets himself too high of a hurdle” (p.25).

One of the most frequently-voiced criticisms of Anarchy, State, and Utopia is that Nozick simply assumes at the outset the claim that individuals possess substantive natural rights. In “Projects and Property”, John T. Sanders attempts to go some way towards providing the theoretical foundations for a broadly-Nozickian conception of property rights. For Sanders, it is a consideration of the crucial role that personal projects play in making life meaningful which explains why we have reasons to respect property rights, since it is the possession of property that creates an environment in which such projects can be fruitfully pursued.

The political and moral views defended in Anarchy, State, and Utopia are strongly deontological or non-consequentialist. In his influential discussion of rights as generating “side constraints” on the behavior of others, Nozick argued that there are fundamental normative constraints on behavior which do not owe their status as such to the role that observing such constraints plays in the promotion of any desirable goals or ends. This aspect of Nozick’s view is challenged by Philip Pettit in his contribution, “Non-Consequentialism and Political Philosophy”. Although at the most general level Pettit’s challenge is a familiar one—that ultimately only the consequentialist is in a position to give a satisfying account of the justification of apparently deontological rules and norms—he develops it in a novel and clear way that will prove challenging to those attracted to non-consequentialist theories in ethics and politics.

In their respective contributions, Loren Lomasky and Gerald Gaus query whether Nozick’s ultimate abandonment of the libertarianism of Anarchy, State, and Utopia is well motivated. In both The Nature of Rationality and The Examined Life (1989), Nozick explicitly disowned his early libertarianism. Although Nozick’s remarks on this score are somewhat cryptic, their general thrust seems clear: libertarianism is inadequate because it does not allow for the symbolic value which derives from certain joint actions that are undertaken by society as a whole. Both Lomasky, in his consideration of the relationship between libertarianism and utopianism, and Gaus, in his consideration of the relationship between Nozick’s political philosophy and his theory of practical rationality, question whether the relevant values must inevitably remain unrealized within a libertarian society.

The remainder of the essays is devoted to topics treated by Nozick in his later work. In “Nozick on Knowledge and Skepticism”, Michael Williams offers a number of objections to Nozick’s influential account of knowledge, according to which a belief counts as knowledge just in case it “tracks the truth”, i.e., reliably covaries with reality across a certain range of close possible situations. Williams suggests that the most fundamental problem for Nozick’s account is one that it shares with other members of a family of theories that Williams labels “pure reliabilist theories”. Specifically, it treats the concept of knowledge

as if it were some kind of purely factual concept…But knowledge is an evaluative concept. We know when we meet certain standards of evidence or good performance in belief (p.152).

Of course, one who is sympathetic to a Nozick-style analysis or (more generally) to “pure reliabilism” will wonder why the having of beliefs that are appropriately sensitive to how things are in reality does not qualify as “good performance in the way of belief”.

Michael Bratman’s essay, “Nozick on Free Will” stands out as a model of sympathetic yet probing analysis. Bratman explores the connections between the possible views on free will canvassed by Nozick in his Philosophical Explanations with the views of personal identity and value defended in the same work. In the course of this exploration, Bratman develops a dilemma for those who, like Nozick, are attracted to libertarianism with respect to free will. (A libertarian about free will believes both that (i) human beings possess free will and that (ii) their doing so is incompatible with the truth of causal determinism. Libertarianism about free will is, of course, not to be confused with libertarianism as a political philosophy.) The dilemma runs as follows. On the one hand, the libertarian needs a positive condition on free will in order to avoid viewing free will as simply the absence of causal determinism; presumably, mere randomness with respect to decision-making would not suffice for genuine freedom. But, once such a condition has been specified, the compatibilist will ask why the presence of that condition does not suffice for free will, even if causal determinism should turn out to be true. Although he does not share Nozick’s libertarian leanings, Bratman seeks to show that Nozick’s insights about human agency can survive transplant into a compatibilist framework.

In contrast to his other works, Nozick’s third book, The Examined Life, has received scant attention from professional philosophers. In his interesting “How to Make Something of Yourself”, Elijah Millgram suggests that “the reception accorded The Examined Life is in the first place a consequence of failing to place it in the genre to which it belongs” (p.176). The book should be understood, Millgram argues, not as the presentation of a philosophical theory but rather as an attempt to construct a distinctive philosophical persona, a concept which Millgram is concerned to explicate. The concluding essay by David Schmidtz, “The Meanings of Life”, differs from the others in that it is not primarily a critical engagement with some aspect of Nozick’s thought but rather “a self-conscious tribute to Nozick, not only in terms of its topic but in terms of its method as well” (p.6).

As mentioned above, the collection Robert Nozick aspires to provide a critical examination of Nozick’s thought as a whole. Relative to this aspiration, the book has both strengths and weaknesses. Among the most notable strengths is that a number of the essays examine connections between aspects of Nozick’s philosophy that have previously been scrutinized only in isolation. (This is especially apparent in the contributions by Gaus and Bratman.) Moreover, the collection also examines some portions of Nozick’s work that have been unduly overshadowed by his more famous writings. (Again, Millgram’s essay on The Examined Life is perhaps the best example of this.) On the other hand, roughly half of the book is concerned with the political philosophy of Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Perhaps as a result of this emphasis, there are some notable omissions, topics to which Nozick has made seminal contributions, which are largely or entirely ignored. Arguably, the emphasis on Nozick’s political philosophy is justified by the fact that it is, after all, the work for which he is best known. On the other hand, it is also that portion of Nozick’s corpus which has been the most thoroughly examined to date. In any case, this emphasis essentially guarantees that the collection will be of greatest potential value to political philosophers. Among the topics omitted, especially salient are Nozick’s important contributions to decision theory (Newcomb’s problem, which Nozick introduced to the philosophical world, is mentioned only once) and to the personal identity debate (his “closest continuer” theory of identity through time is likewise mentioned only once in passing). The claim of the collection to engage with “the full range of Nozick’s work” (made on a cover page) is thus something of an overstatement. Of course, it is a tribute to Nozick’s great range as a philosopher and the sheer number of fields to which he has made important contributions that a collection such as this one can cover considerable ground and yet still manifest such omissions.

The collection is the first volume in the new Contemporary Philosophy in Focus series, which advertises itself as “a series of introductory volumes to many of the dominant philosophical thinkers of the current age”. As such, the volumes “will not presuppose that readers are already intimately familiar with the details of each philosopher’s work”. In fact, most of the essays do provide competent summaries or overviews of the parts of Nozick’s philosophy with which they are concerned. Nevertheless, the volume will be most useful to those who are already well acquainted with the relevant parts of Nozick’s thought and seek critical engagement rather than explication. Those who lack familiarity with Nozick’s thought would be better served by turning directly to the original works themselves.

One addition that would undoubtedly have strengthened the collection is a section of replies by Nozick himself. Throughout his career, however, Nozick scrupulously followed a general policy of not replying to his critics, preferring to direct his attention and energies to new projects instead. Thus, in the Introduction to his collected papers, Nozick explained his failure to reply to the many critics of his political philosophy in the following way:

I have not responded to the sizable literature on Anarchy, State, and Utopia, nor followed it closely. I did not want to spend my life writing “The Son of Anarchy, State, and Utopia”, “The Return of the Son of…”, etc. I had other philosophical questions to think about…(Socratic Puzzles, page 2).

No doubt, there is something admirable in this. Still, a reader of the present collection cannot help but wish that Nozick had made an exception to his general policy in view of the overall high quality of the essays and the many formidable objections that they raise. To give only one, particularly salient, example: as mentioned above, Nozick’s reasons for abandoning the political philosophy that made him famous were never articulated at length, and both Lomasky and Gaus succeed in casting some doubt on the probative force of the reasons at which Nozick gestures. One suspects that it would have been fascinating for Nozick to expand upon and defend his reasons for so fundamental a change of mind. (The absence of detailed replies from Nozick is all the more regrettable in virtue of his recent death, shortly after this collection appeared.) Of course, Nozick’s general policy of not replying to critics issued from the very intellectual restlessness and curiosity that drove him to take up such a wide range of philosophical issues and problems over the course of his career. The reader of the present volume will undoubtedly arrive at a deeper appreciation of just how much the discipline of philosophy benefited as a result.