Romanticism and the Re-Invention of Modern Religion: The Reconciliation of German Idealism and Platonic Realism

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Alexander J. B. Hampton, Romanticism and the Re-Invention of Modern Religion: The Reconciliation of German Idealism and Platonic Realism, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 253pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108429443.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


Contemporary philosophical interest in the movement loosely called Romanticism -- especially in the more narrowly-defined circle of Early German Romantics (Frühromantiker) associated with Schlegel, Novalis and others in the Jena circle -- shows no signs of abating. Part of the renewed interest in the Romantics can of course be explained just in terms of the large philosophical stakes involved in the questions that have most recently been at the forefront of discussion -- for example, whether the Early German Romantics should be characterized as more concerned with issues of epistemology (Manfred Frank), metaphysics (Fred Beiser) or both (Dalia Nassar); whether German Idealism and Romanticism should be considered separately or seen as a dynamic of moments within a larger trajectory extending toward the nineteenth century; and whether the impressive literary achievements of the Romantics should be understood as primarily motivated by philosophical interests, or their philosophy as in the end a literary product itself (Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy).

Alexander J. B. Hampton's reading of the Romantics focuses particularly on a question that turns out to be far more central to the philosophical interests of many early German romantics than has been adequately addressed in recent interpretations: the contribution that the Romantics might make to what Hampton calls the "re-invention of religion." The reason for the neglect -- or dismissal -- of this theme in scholarship on the Romantic era is not hard to find, since it is precisely because of their supposed views of religion that the Romantics are often linked (and not always unfairly) with reactionary and illiberal views of religion's role in the social order. Novalis' appeal to medieval Christianity in his Christendom or Europe was unsettling even at the time for other Romantics, including Schleiermacher (who had arguably the best rhetorical sense of how the movement might address religion's "cultured despisers"), and Schlegel's later turn toward the Catholicism of the Vienna court was fodder for some of his critics' retrospective suspicions regarding his earlier work.

But Hampton's emphasis on the notion of "re-invention" suggests that the Romantics may not have been given sufficient credit over the years for the intellectual rigor and creativity of their engagement with religion. As he argues, the "fundamental concern of Romanticism" could in fact be seen in its "need to create a new language for religion" (p. 1; emphasis mine) -- a claim that is quickly followed by the acknowledgment that "what has hindered an understanding of Romantic religion in the past has been the narrowly defined conceptualization of the term 'religion' itself" (p. 5).

The more particular argument of this book, visible in the subtitle, involves the tracing of an historical background that has not been explored as frequently as it should: namely, the important influence on the Romantics of realism in the Platonic tradition. Hampton does not argue as a matter of intellectual history for "an unbroken genealogy of influence and transmission stretching from antiquity to the late eighteenth century" (p. 125); for the Romantics, "Plato did not represent the weight of an entire tradition of speculative metaphysics, but a model of liberation from restrictive modern philosophical traditions" (p. 126).

Hampton argues that Platonism was of particular interest for the Romantics in that they saw it as offering a sort of "middle ground" between the opposing demands and philosophical approaches of Fichte and Spinoza, allowing them on the one hand to acknowledge the Fichtean insight that the subject plays an active role in structuring reality but on the other hand settling that self within an absolute that is prior (p. 131). (As Novalis put it at one point, Spinozistic nature and the Fichtean "I" are "like two pyramids with a single peak.") What Platonism offers, Hampton argues, is a view of the whole in which an individual participates (the Platonic conception of methexis) but whose striving is essential to whatever grasp of that whole might be possible (the appeals here are to the Platonic notions of eros and poiesis).

On Hampton's reading, there are several key moments that precede the development of the Romantics' appropriation of such strains within Platonism, including the work of Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, Johann Gottfried Herder, and Karl Philipp Moritz. Jacobi and Herder's differing responses to the Spinozistic challenge of immanentism are fairly well known in philosophical scholarship on this period, but Hampton's approach is particularly useful in that he gives due consideration to a figure like Moritz, whose aesthetic and mythological inflection of these issues came to have an influence not only on Schlegel and Novalis but also on Romantics like Wilhelm Heinrich Wackenroder and Ludwig Tieck, who were both students of his.

The book's central explorations in light of this background involve three key figures: Schlegel, Hölderlin and Philipp Friedrich von Hardenberg (Novalis). The individual chapters devoted to these often enigmatic figures are models of clarity and interpretive insight, especially the considerations of Hölderlin's notion of "dissolution as revelation" and Novalis' account of figurative language.

As with many discussions of Jena Romanticism, the question of who is to be regarded as central to the circle and who is an outlier can be a matter of dispute. On the one hand, Hölderlin is included here, even though he is not typically regarded as a part of the Romantic movement in the sense that Schlegel and Novalis were. On the other hand, a figure usually regarded as central to Romanticism such as Schleiermacher is not. (Hampton's grounds for not saying much about the great translator of Plato and 19th century theologian are that much has been written elsewhere about his views on religion, and that the focus of his engagement with Plato was more philological in character.) Also, historically, there are figures important for the connection between Platonism and the Romantic circle who aren't discussed at much length (one particularly noteworthy omission in this context is the Dutch philosopher Franz Hemsterhuis: Novalis wrote Fichte-Studies, but also Hemsterhuis-Studies, which Hampton mentions in passing; and Hemsterhuis had an impact on both Hölderlin's developing Vereinigungsphilosophie and on Schlegel).

Emphasizing the Platonic influence on the Romantics inevitably means, of course, that certain strands of philosophical concern that have over the years drawn many readers to the Romantics tend to be downplayed: the importance of irony (despite the Platonic connection), the motivation of skepticism against supposed foundational premises and the consideration of the role of history and historical contingency (the latter an especially important concern for Schlegel), are themes less central to Hampton's account of the Romantics than to other recent interpretations. Conceptually, Hampton is certainly right about the importance of a Platonic influence on the Romantic figures he considers, but a consideration of influence on a particular movement or line of thought does not necessarily give a complete sense of the trajectory toward which that movement may ultimately be developing. Hampton seems at times to be clear that he doesn't want to argue that the Romantics are metaphysically attempting simply to go back to a pre-critical stance, but rather forward to a new conception. Yet there's a tension in some of his descriptions: he emphasizes, for example, the frequent use among the Romantics of the language of "approximation to an ideal" and reads this as a "Platonic" notion, but it's worth asking whether this term should be viewed primarily as an indebtedness to Plato or as one that betrays a more inherently post-Kantian inflection.

It can also often seem in Hampton's account that there is too close a connection between the terms "religion" and "realism." Yet the project of "reinventing" the concept of religion was equally important for distinctively idealist philosophers of the same period: Fichte, Schelling and Hegel are all, in quite different ways, also concerned with the re-envisioning of religion, and these attempts are perhaps more closely linked to the longer overall story of this period than is suggested here.

How should the legacy of Romanticism with respect to religion be viewed? Hampton is right that "the movement can neither be claimed by a nostalgic and reactionary conservatism nor be read into a Whiggish and secularizing progress narrative" (p. 221). In his concluding discussion, Hampton moves from a consideration of the image of an empty church in one of Novalis' final poems to a meditation on Caspar David Friedrich's sketch of a ruined church in Greifswald, and asks what Romantic strains might be present in the post-Romantic future. He links these reflections on the Romantics' contemporary legacy with respect to religion to larger questions that seem especially of moment these days to scholars working in the philosophy of religion and religious studies, concerned with how (or whether) the concept of "religion" can be defined and how (or whether) philosophers can be helpful in this task. Hampton's book offers a window onto this question that might be of interest in a number of ways. One aspect that might be particularly worth following up on is the importance for the Romantics of the status of art and aesthetics when thinking about the question of the relation between philosophy and religion -- a connection that was obvious to the Romantics but may seem orthogonal to much work in the philosophy of religion today. (Following the suggestion of his title's reference to "re-invention," Hampton pays particular attention in this regard to Herder's notion that ancient myth is worthy of study precisely "so that we ourselves become inventors.")

The culture of Jena at its prime represents one of the most vibrant periods of interaction between philosophy and poetry in Western history, its chief rival perhaps being the brief moment in ancient Athenian life which gave birth to the Platonic dialogue -- a genre of particular richness which itself could both reproduce leading modes of poetry and engage imaginatively and analytically with questions of conventional religious belief and mythology. Hampton's book has suggested one way in which these two historical moments might be importantly linked, and his contribution to the ongoing literature on German romanticism and its importance for the understanding of Western thought from Athens to Jena is one that should be of interest both to philosophers and scholars in fields such as religious studies and literary theory.