Ronald Dworkin

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Arthur Ripstein (ed.), Ronald Dworkin, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 186pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521664127.

Reviewed by Matthew H. Kramer, Cambridge University


This slim but thought-provoking collection of essays on the legal and political and moral philosophy of Ronald Dworkin is the latest volume in the Cambridge University Press's "Contemporary Philosophy in Focus" series.  It comprises an Introduction and five main essays along with a bibliography of secondary works on Dworkin.  The Introduction and the essays together explore most of the main areas of Dworkin's thought, ranging from his anti-Archimedean moral philosophy to his anti-positivist legal philosophy to his egalitarian political philosophy to his liberal constitutional theory.  Arthur Ripstein contributes both the Introduction on Dworkin's anti-Archimedeanism and an essay on Dworkin's egalitarian and anti-pluralistic political philosophy; Scott Shapiro and David Dyzenhaus in their respective essays concentrate on some central aspects of Dworkin's legal philosophy; and the remaining two essays, by Sanford Levinson and by Benjamin Zipursky and James Fleming, focus on some major lines of reasoning in Dworkin's constitutional theory.

Dworkin himself, of course, is wary of the distinctions broached in the preceding paragraph.  He regards constitutional theory as a branch of legal philosophy, and he regards legal philosophy as a branch of political philosophy (which in turn he regards as a branch of moral philosophy).  Moreover, the book under review does not compartmentalize his areas of work as neatly as might be inferred from the description above; themes from some of those areas appear in essays that are primarily concerned with other areas.  Levinson's piece, for example, bestows nearly as much attention upon Dworkin's jurisprudential ideas as upon his constitutional theory.  Nonetheless, although the chief components of Dworkin's thought are obviously interrelated in several respects, they are not indisseverable.  Somebody who thinks highly of his moral philosophy, for example, might take a much less favorable view of his legal philosophy.  Thus, Ripstein has pursued an apt course in obtaining essays that focus on distinct portions of Dworkin's oeuvre.  His own essay focuses chiefly on Sovereign Virtue, whereas the essays by Shapiro and Dyzenhaus concentrate principally on Taking Rights Seriously and Law's Empire; Zipursky and Fleming train their scrutiny mainly on Life's Dominion, while Levinson pays particular attention to Freedom's Law (though also to several of Dworkin's jurisprudential writings).

We are told by the publisher at the front of the book that the volumes in the "Contemporary Philosophy in Focus" series "do not presuppose that readers are already familiar with the details of each philosopher's work."  For the most part, the essays bear out this statement.  Each one is highly lucid, and each contains quite a bit of exposition that will be useful for somebody who does not possess an advanced knowledge of Dworkin's writings.  In that respect, despite the high price for 186 pages, the book is valuable for pedagogical purposes.  (Ripstein's Introduction is less readable than his essay on Dworkin's political philosophy, and it misleadingly presents Dworkin's anti-Archimedeanism as the key to virtually everything in his thought.  Central though anti-Archimedeanism is to Dworkin's outlook in legal and political and moral philosophy, it stands as an accompaniment to his monistic egalitarianism rather than as the source thereof.  To be sure, Dworkin positions himself against certain value-pluralists whom he regards as Archimedeans; but his rejection of their perceived Archimedeanism does not itself preordain his own anti-pluralist and egalitarian allegiances.)

A short review cannot cover every essay.  Hence, my remaining remarks will concentrate on Shapiro's piece.  Shapiro offers a beautifully limpid exposition of the critique of H.L.A. Hart's legal positivism undertaken in Dworkin's early writings, and he convincingly argues that that critique has been countered by Hart's successors.  However, he then maintains that Dworkin's later criticisms of Hart -- advanced mainly in Law's Empire -- have not yet been successfully rebutted.  He proceeds to outline a reply to those later criticisms.

One questionable feature of Shapiro's account of the early attacks by Dworkin on Hartian positivism is his suggestion that Dworkin misunderstood Hart's comments about the exercise of adjudicative discretion in hard cases.  Because Hart maintained that adjudicative officials have to decide hard cases discretionarily in the absence of any legally dispositive norms, and because such officials generally invoke moral principles as the bases for their decisions in those cases, Dworkin inferred that Hart did not regard such principles as legal norms.  He took Hart to believe that adjudicative officials in hard cases must exercise strong discretion -- that is, discretion in the absence of determinative legal norms (rather than discretion in applying such norms).  Shapiro advances the following rejoinder to Dworkin, on pp 29-30:

Although Dworkin's interpretation of Hart is fair, I don't think it is the best explanation for Hart's theory of judicial discretion.  Its major defect stems from the fact that Hart explicitly offered a very different, and more plausible, explanation for his doctrine of strong discretion.  According to Hart, judicial discretion is a necessary byproduct of the inherent indeterminacy of social guidance.  It is impossible, Hart argued, to transmit to others standards of conduct that settle every contingency in advance.  Guidance by precedent is imperfect because, although the exemplar is identified, the relevant standard of similarity is not.  While common sense will eliminate certain similarity standards as inappropriate, there will always be a healthy number of conflicting standards that seem more or less reasonable.  Whereas guidance by legislation might settle some of these doubts, Hart maintained that the use of general terms in statutes cannot eliminate them all.

Shapiro quotes Hart: "There will be plain cases constantly recurring in similar contexts to which general expressions are clearly applicable … but there will also be cases where it is not clear whether they apply or not" (p 30, quoting H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law [Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994, 2nd ed.], 126).

What undermines this defense of Hart is that the view about strong discretion attributed to him by Dworkin is an ontological thesis concerning the inexistence or the indeterminate applicability of dispositive legal norms, whereas the points about guidance recounted by Shapiro are epistemic.  Those latter points, as presented by Shapiro and Hart, concern what seems reasonable and whether the applicability of general expressions is clear and whether doubts have been settled and whether standards of similarity have been identified.  These are all epistemic matters.  By contrast, the existence or inexistence of dispositive legal norms in hard cases is an ontological matter, as is the applicability or inapplicability of any such norm to any particular set of circumstances.  When the epistemic points about guidance are distinguished from the ontological matters concerning the existence and applicability of determinative legal norms, we can see that Dworkin was broadly correct in his critique of Hart.  Insofar as Hart undertook an inferential transition from his epistemic claims about the dearth of guidance in hard cases to his ontological claims about the need for the exercise of strong discretion in such cases, he committed a non sequitur.  If he did not commit that non sequitur, then his claims about strong discretion must instead have been based on the assumption which Dworkin ascribes to him (namely, the assumption that the moral principles invoked by judges to resolve hard cases are not legal norms).

Shapiro subsequently contends that legal positivists have not yet answered Dworkin's later criticisms of Hart that are mounted in Law's Empire.  In particular, he believes that positivists have not yet explained how theoretical disagreements among judges in hard cases are possible.  Such disagreements are centered on the general contents of the standards for ascertaining the existence and substance of legal norms in a given jurisdiction, rather than on some particular implications of law-ascertaining standards whose general contents are not themselves in dispute.  The fact that theoretical disagreements occur among judges in hard cases is problematic for legal positivists, supposedly, because positivists believe that the standards for ascertaining the law in any jurisdiction consist in complex conventions.  Conventions involve patterns of convergent behavior as well as interlocked expectations which guide and impel that behavior.  How, then, can those conventions exist if they are the objects of disagreements among legal officials?  As Shapiro asks (p 41): "How can [positivists] account for disagreements about the legal bindingness of certain facts whose bindingness, by hypothesis, requires the existence of agreement on their bindingness?"  He asserts that "positivists have had little to say about this problem" (p 41), and he goes on to recommend that positivists abandon the idea that the grounds of law are conventional.  "[F]or the positivists to account for the possibility of theoretical disagreements, they should drop their conventionality requirement" (p 44).

Like Shapiro's other work, his sketch of an alternative to the convention-focused account of the grounds of law is sophisticated and piquant.  However, his whole approach to Dworkin's later critique of legal positivism is dubious in several respects.  First, his repeated assertion that positivists have not addressed the possibility of theoretical disagreements is inaccurate.  I myself have addressed that crux at some length in the sixth chapter of my In Defense of Legal Positivism (Oxford University Press, 1999), and I there cite a number of other treatments of the topic.  Quite a few further discussions of the matter have appeared since the publication of that chapter.

Second, and more important, a reader should feel puzzled by Shapiro's suggestion that Dworkin's highlighting of theoretical disagreements in Law's Empire is a major step beyond the criticisms of legal positivism in Taking Rights Seriously.  In fact, as is revealed by an earlier portion of Shapiro's own essay (pp 34-35), Dworkin in Taking Rights Seriously had vigorously contended that the conventionality of the standards for ascertaining the law in any particular jurisdiction would be inconsistent with the occurrence of controversy over those standards among legal officials.  Law's Empire articulates that objection to positivism more elaborately, and it extends the notion of theoretical disagreements to easy cases in which those disagreements remain below the surface, but it does not introduce a fundamentally novel line of reasoning.

Third, there are better responses to Dworkin's arguments about theoretical disagreements than the abandonment of the thesis that the grounds of law are conventional.  For one thing, as positivists have emphasized since Jules Coleman's rejoinders to Dworkin nearly three decades ago, not all disputes among judges in hard cases are theoretical disagreements in Dworkin's sense.  Some of those disputes are centered on specific implications of law-ascertaining criteria rather than on the general contents thereof.  Furthermore, even when the discord among judges does consist in theoretical disagreements, it hardly ever extends to the fundamental layers of the standards for ascertaining the law in this or that jurisdiction.  As I have emphasized in In Defense of Legal Positivism, no functional legal system would exist in a society if the bedrock layers of the standards for ascertaining the society's legal norms were frequently in contention.  Such a situation would involve chaotic deadlocks or civil war rather than the rule of law.  This point is borne out by the examples of theoretical disagreements that are adduced by Dworkin.  All or most of those examples involve disagreements that are quite superficial rather than fundamental; for instance, the most salient issue in some of those examples is whether the plain wording of a statute is always dispositive or whether instead the broader intention of a legislature should be given effect when it diverges from a statute's plain wording.  Disharmony on these relatively superficial matters in difficult cases (which in any event are only a small proportion of the cases overall in any functional legal system) is consistent with the operativeness of a legal system and with the conventionality of its principal standards for ascertaining the existence and substance of its laws.

Fourth, given that the conventionality of the principal standards for ascertaining the law is consistent with the occurrence of theoretical disagreements, there is no need to adopt the desperate tack of denying that those standards are indeed conventional.  To be sure, as is remarked in my discussion of these matters in In Defense of Legal Positivism, an abandonment of the thesis of law's conventionality would not necessarily be inconsistent with legal positivism's insistence on the separability of law and morality.  Nonetheless, as I have also there indicated, the aforementioned thesis should be staunchly retained -- because a legal system in which the processes of law-ascertainment are wholly or predominantly based on convergent independent convictions rather than on interlocked expectations is fanciful.  Such a legal system is not strictly impossible, but it strains any reasonable credence; almost certainly, no such legal system ever has existed or ever will exist.  No jurisprudential theory should present such a system as a central specimen on which we can fruitfully reflect to understand how the operations of legal decision-making typically proceed.

These queries and other queries that could be raised about Shapiro's analyses are scarcely aimed at suggesting that his essay does not repay careful attention.  On the contrary, the essay is a splendidly clear and rigorously argued piece that exhibits the author's characteristic philosophical dexterity.  My objections reflect the capacity of his ambitious chapter to stimulate thought.  Each of the other chapters in the volume is likewise well worth reading, even though each of them is also bound to elicit some criticisms from readers (including this reviewer) -- whether those criticisms be aimed at the authors or at Dworkin himself.  In short, Ronald Dworkin is an admirable addition to the literature on one of the pre-eminent philosophers alive today.