Ironic Life

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Richard J. Bernstein, Ironic Life, Polity, 2016, 167pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781509505739.

Reviewed by Barry Allen, McMaster University


The word "irony" has a standard use, explained in the typical dictionary entry, modeled after Quintilian, of speech whose meaning is contrary to its words. The speaker's words mean one thing, but the speaker means something else, usually the opposite. So it is not challenging to define irony abstractly. A more challenging problem is to describe how it is used. For that we can consult studies of irony in works of literature (Northrop Frye and Wayne C. Booth, for instance). For the use of irony in philosophical writing, we can read work in Continental philosophy on Søren Kierkegaard, Friedrich Schlegel, Friedrich Nietzsche, and Walter Benjamin. A third problem concerns the value of irony. Irony can be more than a figure of speech, and its poetic use need not be limited to works of literature. Irony can be a whole philosophy of life.

Anglophone philosophers have been cool toward the topic of irony -- incurious, even reluctant to broach it. There are exceptions; Richard J. Bernstein studies two of them, Richard Rorty and Jonathan Lear.

In A Case for Irony (2011), Lear claims to recover true Socratic ironism after millennia of superficial distortion. Irony is no mere figure of speech. It is a revolution of the soul. He attributes to irony a power of defamiliarization and an "enigmatic longing" to aspire and not merely pretend. Lear relies on Kierkegaard for his egregious idea that irony is a requirement on a "genuinely human" life. Irony is the fundament of virtue. "No genuinely human life is possible without irony." Not just irony in general, but the specific ironical self-knowledge that "it is constitutive of human excellence to understand -- that is, to grasp practically -- the limits of human understanding of such excellence." This virtue is not Greek, or Socratic, or Platonic, or Western. It is "human."

Bernstein thinks Lear fails to offer a good reason for equating excellence with this experience of irony, or for the claim that no genuinely human life is possible without irony. One can hardly fail to agree with him. Bernstein paints an unappealing picture of Lear. He tries to be fair, but the dissatisfaction with psychoanalytic knowingness creeps through, and we can be glad that it does, and even wish it had more.

Lear sniffs at Rorty's liberal ironist. But for Bernstein, Rorty's life and work exemplify the best part of what Lear says about irony. Rorty's writings stirred discontent with the pretenses of analytic philosophy, and encouraged many to look for new questions in new directions. Bernstein would not be Bernstein, however, if he did not make a couple of good critical observations. One concerns Rorty's dichotomy between argument and redescription. Rorty tries to laugh off the suggestion that he is presenting arguments, and say instead that he merely offers redescriptions.

Bernstein thinks this is a terrible idea. What does Rorty suppose argument is? His canon, seldom (if ever) made explicit, draws from Aristotle and Carnap: clearly demarcated premises and a conclusion incontrovertibly derived by uncontroversial rules of validity. If that is what an argument is, then Rorty's work is not argument. But neither is ninety-nine percent of anything we describe as argued or well reasoned. It is a terrible model, that makes nonsense of practice professional and ordinary.

As for redescription, that turns out to be rather closer to what the rest of us call argument. Everything that makes Rorty's idea of redescription ("mere" redescription) different from what he deigns to call (real, proper) argument, the more closely it corresponds with argument as people, including him, actually practice it.

Rorty explained the wisdom of irony by referring to the unavailability of what he called non-circular justification. The value of non-circular justification requires the caricature of argument Bernstein objects to. If, to avoid presumably fatal circularity, a proffered justification has to be the necessary outcome of Rorty's Carnapian canon, then, yes, most justification will be circular, which may provoke nihilism, against which Rorty substitutes irony and renewed ethical passion. But is this really the right norm to apply outside of the most demanding deductive sciences? Why do deductive sciences get to establish the norms of valid justification? Bernstein makes all of these points, not commonly appreciated or pointed out, very well.

For Rorty, the choice is irony or nihilism. Because values that can be embraced earnestly, without irony are no more. That is Rorty's postmodernism. So it is either nihilism, or learning to live ironically. Rorty rediscovers Kierkegaard's ethical passion, released by the irony that tolerates the fact that there is no "non-circular" justification for the liberalism to which he is ethically attached.

A second chapter discusses some recent Anglophone scholarship on the Socratic Problem, in which the nature and value of Socratic irony looms large. Gregory Vlastos is relatively confident about being able to discern a reliable portrait of Socrates in Plato's dialogues, while Alexander Nehamas is implacably skeptical, judging Plato's Socrates to be a literary fiction.

For Vlastos, Socrates incarnated a new and for us still contemporary meaning of "irony," serious in mockery, earnest in playfulness. Simple irony is when we say one thing, usually false, and mean something else, usually the opposite. What is implied is not said and what is said is literally false. In the "complex" irony he finds in Socrates, what is said both is and is not seriously meant, and true taken one way, false taken another way.

Nehamas thinks there is more to Socrates's irony than that. It has an additional quality of concealment. What is said is true in a way, but that way is concealed. For instance, Socrates tempted Alcibiades into his futile seductions for a pedagogic purpose that was concealed from the would-be disciple. Someone can know that Socrates is being ironic but not know what he means. The understanding is withheld, probably because the hearer is considered unworthy of the knowledge.

Vlastos and Nehamas agree that Socrates succeeded in creating a new form of life with his combination of irony and philosophy. And Bernstein agrees with them both that the key to Socrates's irony is not in what he says but what he does, how he lives. Yet he thinks Nehamas overstates his difference from Vlastos, who did not claim that Socratic irony is transparent, as if one could readily recover the speaker's meaning behind the words, as one usually can with simple irony. As for Nehamas's idea that Socratic irony is concealing, that Socrates withholds something he knows, Bernstein insists that Socrates is not a school-master quizzing others while knowing the answers himself. He instills in them a perplexity he feels.

After Socrates, Kierkegaard is an inevitable topic. Despite vitriolic criticism of Hegel, including what he says of Socrates, Kierkegaard nevertheless agrees with the Master when in his dissertation, The Concept of Irony, he defines Socrates's irony as infinite absolute negativity. Infinite, because unconstrained by any specific target but directed at the entire actuality of his time; negative, because incapable of offering a positive alternative; absolute because resolute, the negativity accepted and no pretense to an alternative.

For Kierkegaard, this is key to understanding Socrates's inwardness. What is distinctive of Socrates is the radicalness with which he detaches and isolates himself from his time and place. For Kierkegaard this power of radical negation is essential to the dignity of human being.

Consistent irony must be consistently negative, and then ironically turns against its own irony, ironically refraining from affirming irony or becoming earnest about it. The consistent ironist discovers the limit of irony in the limit of disengagement, the impossibility of disengaging from his own disengagement. In Kierkegaard's movement from the dissertation to the works of Johannes Climacus, consistent irony becomes ethical passion, passion in a certain direction, in other words, choice, free choice, and individuality.

Absolute negativity is but a first moment, in which one distances oneself from what actually exists, current Sittlichkeit. Romantic ironists never get beyond this. Ethical passion is lacking. Rorty's liberal ironist is an American version of Kierkegaard's knight of faith. Irony was for Rorty a way of diverting postmodern nihilism and becoming re-attached to worldly projects. Turn away from futile foundations, return to concrete practices; turn away from obsessive concern with objectivity, return to solidarity with others.

In his concluding chapter, Bernstein reflects on what all of his authors are saying about the value of irony both in philosophy and life. Drawing on terms explored by Pierre Hadot, Michel Foucault, and Nehamas, Bernstein expresses dissatisfaction with the Anglophone, and increasingly global, institutionalization of theoretical philosophy, and professional amnesia for philosophy as an ethical art of life.

We do not have to choose between one or the other. No philosophy will succeed as a philosophical art of life if it is not also theoretically good philosophy, and vice versa. The question is rather one of balance. The misgiving outsiders feeling toward current hyper-specialization in philosophy is that something is lost in the specialist's indifference to broader, vaguer -- one might almost say, philosophical -- questions about the point and value of the inquiries.

Maybe scientific specialization can evade the question with its uncheckable promise of technological advance. But that argument does not work for philosophy. What are we learning, what is at stake, how will it contribute to self-knowledge, why is it worth doing? These are tough questions, and one understands why certain philosophers would prefer to avoid them. But they are real questions, and others will ask them if philosophers do not.