Rorty and Kierkegaard on Irony and Moral Commitment: Philosophical and Theological Connections

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Brad Frazier, Rorty and Kierkegaard on Irony and Moral Commitment: Philosophical and Theological Connections, Palgrave Macmillan, 2006, 260pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 1403975981.
University of Victoria

Reviewed by G. Elijah Dann, University of Victoria


Brad Frazier's book offers a close examination of Richard Rorty's and Søren Kierkegaard's understandings of irony, and irony's connection to the manner by which ethics and moral commitment unfold in their respective writings. Frazier equally divides his discussion of Rorty and Kierkegaard, allocating three chapters each to their views and the subsequent difficulties that have been presented by critics. A concluding chapter all too briefly compares and contrasts Rorty's and Kierkegaard's views on irony and moral commitment.

The introductory chapter discusses the development of irony and moral commitment which are presented as the two necessary ingredients in the life of someone who has "the critically engaged stance." [1] The immediate foil for this broadly stated position is Alasdair MacIntyre. MacIntyre's criticisms, while not explained by Frazier at any great length (only a couple pages at the hundred-page mark), are perhaps a handy introductory cum rhetorical device for charting out the philosophical turf at stake in the definition of irony and its contribution to the moral life. But pitting foils against his protagonists (especially when dealing with Rorty) is a methodology that Frazier frequently employs. He repeatedly cites detractors, explains their criticisms, but ultimately shows how they don't exactly come to grips with the full force of Rorty's metaphilosophy. I happen to think that Frazier is right to temper the remarks of Rorty's selected critics, but his discussion of Rorty is too bound up in this strategy, and it doesn't fully free-up Frazier's own thinking to bear on the issue. This is unfortunate because in the parts where Frazier shows his own independent acumen, it is judicious and well-informed.

In any case, Rorty's irony is part of his notion of contingency. It requires skepticism about any "final vocabulary" that anyone or any group might want to use to explain their lives -- and ours. If this earthly existence were not imbued in contingency, and the world could be described as it truly is (which, of course, Rorty believes doesn't make sense), then our choices to think and live otherwise, morally speaking at least, would be removed. This leads us back to MacIntyre, and to the charge that "irony" is associated with a kind of critical disengagement that is inimical to commitments and relationships, two elements necessary for holding together human communities.

Frazier takes on MacIntyre and other detractors of Rorty to show, largely based on his Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, that irony for Rorty is in close relation to the individual's quest for "self-creation" and "getting out from under inherited vocabularies by forging one's own terms for describing, understanding, and evaluating oneself and others." [16] The moral component to Rorty's understanding of irony, contingency, and final vocabularies, and the freedom (or autonomy) that follows, is explored by Frazier in his second chapter, "The Ethics of Rortian Redescription."

Given contingency, we are able to "redescribe" ourselves, not as any old self, but, at least minimally, as one which recognizes "a common aversion to humiliation." This recognition is a minimal grounding that "implies a commitment to liberalism … because they have an aversion to cruelty that is as basic as their desire for novel self-creation." [34]

Those familiar with Rorty know the problems that these premises raise. There are, indeed, even more controversial claims made by Rorty, one of the more infamous being the "anything claim": Given contingency and no final vocabulary, "ironists recognize that anything including any vocabulary can be made to look good or bad by being redescribed" [37].  In chapter 2 ("The Ethics of Rortian Redescription") Frazier takes a look at the strongest criticisms of Rorty, particularly those of Michele Moody-Adams and Jean Bethke Elshtain. Frazier believes both Moody-Adams and Elshtain fail to see that Rortian ironists are not susceptible to this redescription due to recognizing the need to avoid cruelty, a basic yet stabilizing morality.

Frazier's third chapter on Rorty, "Autonomy and Moral Commitment in Liberal Irony: Problems and Proposals," looks at some other charges of contradiction made against him. The particular charge that Frazier looks at in this chapter asks how, if autonomy allows us to get out from under inherited vocabularies, do we manage to hold to a liberal ironist position that itself withstands irony and destabilizing contingency? As before, Frazier first presents one of the hard-sayings of Rorty, followed by reiterating Rorty's strongest critics.  At the end of the chapter he shows how, with a little nuancing or closer reading of Rorty, his views become more palatable. Frazier shows that recognizing the contingency of our self-description doesn't necessarily throw us into abject relativism where we cannot question descriptions.

Chapters 4, 5 and 6 move to a study of Søren Kierkegaard's understanding of irony and moral commitment. Frazier is clear early on that while he is able to defend Rorty's view of irony and all its components against some of Rorty's strongest critics, Kierkegaard's view of irony is more thoughtfully developed and nuanced.

Looking first at The Concept of Irony, Frazier presents a multifaceted understanding of irony. As pure irony, it tries to push away any form of commitment to pursue "negative freedom." This is self-defeating however, at least as far as the moral life is concerned since relationships with the absence of commitment cannot be solidly held. Despite the pure ironist's attempt to shed the trivialities that occupy the mind of the common citizen, without commitment to anything but their irony, they succumb to social influences which slowly "collapses into crude social conformity." [131]

But Kierkegaard doesn't abandon irony altogether, as evidenced in his description of "mastered irony." In chapter 5 Frazier shows how Kierkegaard's pure irony differs from mastered irony. The latter is accomplished through moral commitment, both to the good of the person, and to the ideal of goodness and moral obligation. In short, Frazier defends the use of irony, as mastered irony, because it contributes to the maturing of the moral life. Yet even mastered irony has its limitations as it also retains "negativity."

In chapters 6 and 7 Frazier goes on to explain Kierkegaard's most developed understanding of irony through his Postscript.  Using the pseudonym Johannes Climacus, Kierkegaard is able to further develop his account of irony and its role in the moral life. Of particular interest is "irony as an incognito of the ethical." [181] When the moral agent has self-realization, guarding against the temptation to show-boat her ethical virtue, she instead, among other things, is better able to hold to her moral ideals and convictions by not publicly announcing them. "[T]here is always a gap between what they aspire to be as moral agents and what they are in reality." [185]

There is much to Frazier's study that is of value. His treatment of Kierkegaard's complicated and highly nuanced views on irony and the moral life is elucidating and well-organized. These chapters have much to offer both to those who wish a solid introduction to Kierkegaard and to the specialist. I found, however, Frazier's chapters on Rorty relying too heavily on the formula of first presenting one of Rorty's more controversial views, then repeating critics' responses, with Frazier finally showing (at least most of the time) how these critics have misunderstood Rorty. If overused this is a tactic which bears too much similarity to that of a doctoral dissertation. Some footnotes are missing too, for instance where Frazier states what I would think would be a controversial claim ("Rorty also endorses the virtue of truthfulness" [58]), or a bibliographical note where Frazier mentions Rorty's Against Bosses [67].

The reader might also be misled by the title of the book, with the subtitle suggesting that the philosophical and theological connections between Rorty and Kierkegaard will be investigated. Instead, their views on irony and moral development are presented in their respective chapters quite independent of deeper comparison and contrast. Frazier's last chapter, thirteen pages in length, isn't enough to show these connections in a two-hundred page book.