Rossian Ethics: W.D. Ross and Contemporary Moral Theory

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David Phillips, Rossian Ethics: W.D. Ross and Contemporary Moral Theory, Oxford University Press, 2019, 216pp. $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190602185.

Reviewed by Philip Stratton-Lake, University of Reading


David Phillips presents the first book-length discussion of Ross's moral theory. It consists of five chapters covering not only his theory of prima facie duties, but also his pluralist view about the good, as well as his meta-ethics and epistemology. Much of the book is persuasive, both as an interpretation of Ross, and as a plausible moral theory. Phillips is critical of Ross's epistemology, but accepts the main aspects of his normative theory and metaethics. I think Phillips' most important and interesting contribution is his novel interpretation of the notion of a prima facie duty, in particular, the special duties of fidelity, reparation and gratitude. (More on that below.) But there are excellent discussions of each of the topics covered.

Chapter one introduces Phillips' project and methodology. In chapter two he considers the nature of prima facie duties, how these relate to moral reasons, and how best to understand a form of deontology based on them. He argues, against Thomas Hurka, that the concept of a prima facie duty is best understood in terms of moral reasons. He takes up Michael Smith's suggestion that we define the moral/non-moral distinction in terms of unselfish and selfish reasons. That prima facie duties are moral reasons is my own view, so I agree with Phillips as far as that goes. His argument for this, based on Ross's discussion of whether we have a prima facie duty to get pleasure for ourselves, is novel, and in my view, quite compelling. But he regards this interpretation as the most "important revisionary element" of his reading of Ross (35). My own view is that this is not revisionary at all. The concept of a prima facie duty is clearly the concept of a moral consideration that counts for or against some act, and that is just another way of saying that it is the concept of a moral reason for or against some act. That Ross did not use the term 'reason' does not mean that it does not pick out the concept he was struggling to articulate for so long.

Phillips rejects the view that we should define moral obligation in terms of moral reasons (what he calls scalar deontology) in favour of a view according to which neither prima facie duty nor duty proper can be defined in terms of the other. (42) Ross neither was, nor ought to be a scalar deontologist, according to Phillips.

In chapter three Phillips considers what prima facie duties there are. He offers a novel account of the prima facie duties of fidelity, gratitude, and reparation, according to which they are what he calls (following Dancy) agent-relative intensifiers (64ff), and goes on to argue that this form of deontology is better than a standard form which includes agent-centred constraints and permissions (79ff).

In chapter four Phillips turns to Ross's view about the good. Phillips is sympathetic to Ross's pluralism about the good, according to which there are three basics goods (pleasure, virtue, and knowledge) and one higher order good (justice), but argues against Ross's strong anti-hedonistic view. He also argues that Ross overvalues virtue.

In the final chapter Phillips considers Ross's metaethics and epistemology. He broadly endorses the former, but is critical of the latter. The epistemology Ross inherited from Cook-Wilson and Prichard is, he argues, too dogmatic, and his claims about the special epistemic status of judgements of prima facie duty are indefensibly strong.

Although the most interesting part of the book for me was his discussion of prima facie duties, I was not persuaded by the key elements of his interpretation of Ross. One way in which I disagree is philosophical, and the other is exegetical. The philosophical disagreement pertains to his understanding of the moral/non-moral distinction. I agree that prima face duties are best understood as moral reasons, but I don't think his account of the moral/non-moral distinction is persuasive.

Philips argues that the difference between moral and non-moral reasons in Ross is to be understood in terms of their content (34). Moral reasons on this view are non-selfish reasons, and non-moral ones are selfish. But it is awkward to apply the concept of the selfish to normative reasons, rather than to acts and motivating reasons, where the notion is more at home. Furthermore, I understand the content of a reason as what the reason favours. If that is right, then the idea of a selfish normative reason cannot be understood with reference to its content.

To see this, consider an act that would benefit me as well as someone else. A natural way to decide whether my act would be selfish is not to ask what I would do, but why I would do it. Plenty of non-selfish acts benefit the agent. What would make my act selfish is not the fact that it would benefit me, but whether I did it because it would benefit me, or because it would benefit the other person. So what makes this act selfish is not determined by what I did, but by why I did it.

How do we apply this to normative reasons? The place-holder for a motive in relation to normative reasons seems to be the reason-giving fact. But what fact would make the reason it grounds selfish? The fact that the act would benefit me is clearly a selfish fact in this context. But what about the fact that the act would benefit my family or my village? That might well benefit me as well as others (in my family or town). Does that make it both selfish and unselfish, or neither?

Also, it is not clear that the selfish and the moral are contradictories, for some non-selfish reasons are not moral. The fact that a 100m runner is the fastest in the world gives me reason to admire his athletic abilities, and to persuade others that they should admire him. But the fact that he is the fastest 100m runner in the world is neither selfish nor moral. There are many other examples as well, especially if we include reasons to believe.

But perhaps the selfish/moral distinction only applies to practical reasons rather than to evaluative or epistemic ones. Could there be non-selfish practical reasons that are not moral? On the face of it, it looks like there are. Suppose I set myself some worthwhile goal. If the goal is valuable, then I have reason to take steps to realise it. But the goal need not be morally worthwhile, and the reasons it involves need not be moral reasons. Suppose the worthwhile goal is to get a better understanding of some period of history. The reasons I have to pursue this goal are provided by whatever it is that makes this goal worth pursuing. That may be the fact that acquiring such knowledge will benefit me, but it need not be. And it is quite plausible to suppose, as Scanlon does, that this goal could only benefit me if it is good on other grounds. If that is right, the reason that grounds its value could not be selfish in the specified sense. But it is also not a moral reason. So the moral and the unselfish come apart.

So although I agree with Phillips that principles of prima facie duty are best understood as principles specifying which facts give us moral reason to act in certain ways, I am not persuaded by his account of the moral, and if this is a correct interpretation of Ross, then I think Ross is wrong on this point. How to characterise the moral/non-moral distinction is notoriously hard, and it is not clear what the alternative would be, or even if we need an alternative so long as we can distinguish the moral from the non-moral. But it seems to me that an account in terms of content is not promising.

I now move on to my exegetical disagreement, which relates to Phillips' interpretation of the prima facie duties of fidelity, reparation, and gratitude. He argues that these special obligations are best understood as agent-relative intensifiers of the sort of reasons that ideal consequentialists already endorse. To clarify this idea, Phillips focuses on promises, but it is easy to see how it would apply to gratitude and reparation. The idea is that these non-consequentialist considerations are morally relevant, not by providing additional reasons to consequentialist reasons, but by intensifying reasons already recognised by the consequentialist. The mere fact that my act would benefit you in some way gives me a reason to do this act. If I promise that I will give you this benefit, then I have more reason to confer it on you. But this is not because the fact that I promised gives me a further reason. Rather it is because my promise intensifies the single reason I have independently of any promise made.

This is an original and interesting reading of Ross, and Phillips provides textual evidence to support it. But on balance I do not think that Ross's special obligations can be read in this way. This is because this reading is incompatible with Ross's view that all prima facie duties are right-making features. It is clear that Ross thought of prima facie duties as right-making features, as Phillips himself acknowledges (158). So the facts that figure in the basic duties pick out the features that ultimately make acts right, when they are right. So, for instance, if the prima facie duty of fidelity is undefeated, the right thing to do will be whatever it is I have promised to do, and what makes that the right act is the fact that I have promised to do it.

Now it seems to me that if some fact makes an act right (in the peremptory rather than the mere permissibility sense of right -- i.e., obligatory), then that fact will give the agent a reason to do the right act. So, if the fact that I have promised you that I would Ф is the reason why Фing is right, then the fact that I promised to Ф gives me a reason to Ф, and one might hope that I would Ф for that reason. The same is true if I ought to benefit you because you benefitted me in the past. If that past fact explains why I ought to confer this benefit on you, then that fact gives me a reason to do so. So it seems to me that the following principle is true:

ER - If some fact explains why I ought to Ф, that same fact gives me a reason to Ф.

Although Ross did not think in terms of reasons, I see no reason to suppose that he would deny ER. The problem for Phillip's reading of Ross's special obligations is that it commits him to denying ER. For if promissory facts, or facts about past wrongs or past benefits, are not themselves normative reasons, but rather simply intensify reasons provided by other facts, then assuming he sticks to the view that for Ross such facts are right-makers, we will have right-making facts that are not reason-giving facts. And that contradicts ER.

That some fact intensifies a reason provided by some other facts does not in principle prevent the intensifier from also providing a reason to do the same act. I am not aware of a principled reason for supposing that intensifiers cannot also be reasons. So one way of making Phillips' interpretation of Ross consistent with ER would be to suppose that the facts that figure in Ross's special obligations are both intensifiers and reasons. But this is not Phillips' view, and I think it would exaggerate the role that special obligations play. My view is, therefore, that this is a philosophically uncharitable reading of Ross.

Another reason to reject this interpretation is that it would lose a unified account of prima facie duties. Some prima facie duties would pick out reasons, whereas others would pick out intensifiers of those reasons. There is a distinction between general obligations and special obligations in Ross. But I think that is best understood as a distinction between reasons (agent-neutral versus agent-relative reasons) rather than as a distinction between reasons and something else. So there is more unity among the prima facie duties than Phillips allows.

But even if what Phillips says about special obligations does not fit with Ross's overall picture, it is a novel and interesting view, which has, I think independent philosophical plausibility. Overall, then, his book is well-argued, engaging, with novel exegetical and philosophical insights. It is a welcome addition to the growing literature on intuitionism, and will certainly be on my reading list when I teach the subject.