Rousseau and German Idealism: Freedom, Dependence and Necessity

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David James, Rousseau and German IdealismFreedom, Dependence and Necessity, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 233pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107037854.

Reviewed by Sally J. Scholz, Villanova University


Jean-Jacques Rousseau inspired and infuriated his contemporaries; it should come as no surprise that subsequent scholars would be similarly vexed in assessing his influence and legacy. David James offers a glimpse into the debates, describing his project as providing "a more systematic exploration of the significance of some of the central features of Rousseau's writings in relation to [Kant, Fichte, and Hegel's] own theories concerning the ethical, social and political aspects of human existence" (1). He suggests that focusing on freedom, dependence, and necessity is the avenue to follow in tracing Rousseau's influence on German Idealism.

James's book seeks to reclaim Rousseau's place in the philosophical tradition of German idealism, but the labor to do so is sometimes confused in such a way that we end up with a Rousseau read through German Idealism, a Rousseau who no longer looks much like himself.

James distinguishes his position from the neo-republican position represented by Philip Pettit and then offers a lengthier summary of the three key ideas -- freedom, dependence, and necessity -- in Rousseau. Within this discussion, he argues that Rousseau's account of dependence in the Second Discourse describes not the transition from dependence on things to dependence on other people, but the transition from dependence on things to "dependence on other human beings as mediated by dependence on things" (26). Whereas Rousseau himself discusses the pernicious effects of dependence on others and cautions Emile to be dependent only on God and nature, James argues that his proposed alternate form of dependence is bound up in Rousseau's disdain for public opinion. Public opinion is premised on social inequality. James explains:

Dependence on the opinions of others can, therefore, be regarded as a specific form of dependence on other human beings. This form of dependence is nevertheless rooted in existing material inequalities, and for this reason it can be viewed as a form of dependence on other human beings that is mediated by dependence on things. (36)

This mediated dependence becomes the focal point of much of the book. James' ambition is to show that Rousseau means to point to systemic domination, not just interpersonal domination, and that systemic domination can appear without ill intention on the part of those who dominate. He needs this in order to argue against what he takes to be the neo-republican position, although that part of the argument drops away as the book proceeds. As James explains in the introduction,

Rousseau's recognition of the way in which certain forms of domination are not of a directly interpersonal kind, since they are mediated by material objects that have come to form essential elements in a complex system of need-generation and need-satisfaction, renders more difficult the task of explaining how a condition of human interdependence can be organized in such a way that it does not generate relations of domination. (7)

It is not clear, however, that Rousseau needs the third category of dependence on other human beings mediated by things that James creates on his behalf. In fact, one might argue that including that form of dependence yields an account of dependence that misconstrues Rousseau's. First of all, the modified category may not actually add anything that Rousseau himself hadn't already posited. Throughout all of his writings he warns against an individual becoming dependent on others, whether materially dependent or psychologically dependent on the opinion of others. Becoming the slave to another person because of material want could be understood as a dependency mediated by a thing (money), but there is no difference according to Rousseau's account of slavery between being monetarily dependent on another and physically dependent on another. The wealthy are also dependent on their slaves. Adding the mediation through money does not appear to alter the account. Further, Rousseau's admonition of the dangers of being dependent on others can be understood on both the interpersonal and systemic levels without appealing to the mediation of money or public opinion. The class system that emerges in the Second Discourse illustrates that point.

In an interesting contrast, Rousseau instructs Sophie, Emile's woman of nature, that she ought to be subject to or dependent on the constraints of public opinion. The rules of dependency on public opinion at least are gendered and not always related to material inequality. Given that the discussion of Sophie is one of the places in Rousseau's corpus where dependency on opinion and dependency on other human beings is discussed in some detail, it is all the more surprising that James does not take it up, especially given his interest in need-generation and need-satisfaction. Consider, for instance, the provocative comment Rousseau makes in Book V of Emile that a man's desires make him dependent on woman, and both her desires and her needs make woman dependent on man. Dependency on others is dangerous regardless of whether it is mediated through things or not. The trick is to have individuals as good as Sophie and Emile in the social mix.

The pernicious effects of dependency on others are most clear when property is introduced. James traces the role of property in creating social dependency; the accumulation of property that one cannot manage on one's own creates dependency on others for both the wealthy and the poor. Rousseau calls that dependence on other people; James calls it dependence on other people mediated by things (property or money). The difference is negligible if we consider that Rousseau's account of wealth accumulation is causally and directly connected to poverty. That is, the acquisition of wealth by some causes the impoverishment of others. He makes this point explicit in his essay "On Wealth" (2005).

James needs his modified category -- dependence on other human beings mediated by things -- in order to present his interpretation of Rousseau and to answer the question of why individuals would accept the limitations to their freedom that the constraints of law entail. I am suggesting it risks misconstruing Rousseau and obscuring the causal connection between wealth accumulation and impoverishment. Of course, pushing this line of argument makes me sound a lot like the neo-republicans against whom, at least in the introduction, James claims to be arguing. Where we differ is in his claim that neo-republican accounts of threats to freedom are limited to interpersonal domination. There is room for systemic domination, and, indeed, as James rightly points out, Rousseau himself is concerned about both interpersonal and systemic.

In tracing Rousseau's influence on German Idealism, James turns next to the claim that Kant is the best interpreter of Rousseau. Although he sees much to bolster that claim, he also notes a crucial difference between the two: "Kant develops a theory of the radical evil in human nature, whereas Rousseau is commonly associated with the claim that human beings are naturally good" (53). James follows this insight to argue that Kant's liberal view is in many ways quite different from Rousseau's, and at least part of what is missing is a theory of property of the sort that Fichte provides. Connecting Fichte's dictum that "'everyone ought to be able to live from his labor'" to Rousseau's rule that "one should occupy only as much land as one needs to subsist" (114), James develops Fichte's theory of property complete with material inequality such that one may "live as agreeably as possible given the conditions of the society in which he or she lives" (115). Although there may be some constraints on luxury, constraints that ensure the basic necessities of fellow citizens, Fichte does not appear to have the same commitment to socioeconomic equality so as to ensure civil equality that Rousseau does.

The discussion of Fichte is less about Rousseau's influence on the former or even about Fichte proving the more able interpreter of Rousseau's ideas than Kant. Instead, James argues for the superiority of Fichte over Rousseau in developing a theory of property that James takes to be consistent with Rousseau. He reads Rousseau through Fichte rather than the other way around. This is particularly evident in the structure of the argument. James suggests that certain points in Fichte's account are "not incompatible" (109) with Rousseau, or that the accounts "resemble" one another (110), or that Fichte's account "invites comparison" or "recalls" Rousseau's (131). Indeed, James himself recognizes the significant difference between the two thinkers (113, n.11 and 115, n.13) regarding the role of the state, equality, and luxury, but that does not prevent him from arguing that Fichte offers a Rousseauian theory of property.

The lessons on property in Rousseau are much more developed than James gives him credit for. Rousseau's essay Political Economy (1997a) is a rich source both for the individual right to property and the state's obligation both to ensure that right and to provide for the welfare of other members of society. In addition, Rousseau's account of property in Emile, which James does discuss briefly, appears within a larger account of charity. In other words, the tutor teaches about property in order to teach the child about tending to the needs of others. Rousseau has the tutor explain that he is temporarily the master of money, but a condition of ownership is the obligation or promise to care for the poor. James presents the property example from Emile, wherein Emile plants beans in a plot of land that had been cultivated by the gardener, as a lesson in the right of first ownership through labor. Rousseau's account of this example, however, includes a contrast with Locke on charity; whereas the former aims at teaching generosity, Locke sees charity as a means of getting back more in return. The tutor, according to Rousseau, is to guide Emile so that he gives generously from his property (which, after all, he enjoys merely as a temporary possession) rather than giving what is useless to him or what he expects to get back. Rousseau's account of property from this example in Emile, then, ought to be understood within the context of his larger discussion of charity (1979, 59-69).

The third great thinker of German Idealism whose debt to Rousseau has been widely acknowledged is Hegel. James begins by noting that "Hegel praises Rousseau for making the will into the principle of the state" (143). James argues that Hegel's theory of civil society supports the claim that the "modern form of ethical life (Sittlichkeit) can itself be interpreted in such a way as to make it appear much closer to social contract theory -- and to Rousseau's version of it in particular" than Hegel claims (144). He uses Hegel's notion of subjective freedom, which he argues is a positive model of freedom involving "some form of self-determination through which an individual realizes him- or herself" (150), united with objective freedom as the content of "the modern form of ethical life" (160). This is important, James suggests, as it connects the individual will to the general will. Hegel comes up short, however, insofar as he fails to bridge the gap between particularity and universality, a gap James claims Rousseau fills by "imposing order on the forces and particular interests governing society" (155).

James clearly presents Kant as both one of the chief heirs of Rousseau and one of the important interpreters of Rousseau, albeit also differing from him in significant ways. The discussions of Fichte and Hegel offer a less conclusive relation. James seems to shift his focus to finding elements of their thought that might be used to enhance Rousseau's theories rather than finding the Rousseauian influence in their ideas.

The book ends with a discussion of idleness. Here, James contrasts Fichte on leisure, which is presented as entailed in the right to property (209), with Rousseau's autobiographical reflections in the Reveries, written late in life, on his desire to be idle. One might suggest that a more promising comparison would be Rousseau's more theoretical essays, the First and Second Discourses, where idleness is discussed as a moral failing of the wealthy. It is also worth noting that in all of his autobiographical writings, Rousseau strove to lay bare his faults and failings. His expression of desire for indolence, then, ought not to be read as a statement advocating idleness, but might be read as the self-revelation of a flawed disposition.

Some of my concern with James' approach to idleness is rooted in his presentation of "perfectibility." He takes it to be a teleological concept pertaining to individual moral development, which he connects to Fichte's use of the term. That does not fit well with Rousseau's use of "perfectibility," however. For Rousseau, perfectibility indicates the drive to develop or progress, not necessarily to a particular goal and certainly not toward "perfection." Perfectibility is part of what distinguishes us from "the brutes," but, of course, Rousseau does not think that "progress" is necessarily toward moral perfection. The Second Discourse, wherein he uses the concept of perfectibility, makes that clear. Reading perfectibility as seeking moral perfection misconstrues Rousseau's account of freedom and dependency. The discussion of Fichte's notion of perfectibility raises a question: Is James tracing the influence of Rousseau in Fichte's thought or is he reading Rousseau through Fichte?

In the end, it is not entirely clear who is the intended audience of this book. James seeks to reveal the real Rousseauian influence on Kant, but, as I have suggested here, there may be significant Kantian, Fichtean, and Hegelian influences on James' reading of Rousseau. The project to present a response to neo-republican readings of Rousseau and the project to recover Rousseau's influence on Kant, Fichte, and Hegel end up sometimes being at odds with each other. Nevertheless, a study of dependence and necessity in relation to freedom is a valuable endeavor, and Rousseau is the right political philosopher to motivate it.

Rousseau is a notoriously difficult thinker. His famous legislator has been accursed as modeling totalitarian aspirations even while the general assembly inspires radical democracy movements all over the world. Interpreters of Rousseau will no doubt continue to grapple with his ideas, and it might be worth wondering if our conclusions tell us more about ourselves than they do about Rousseau.


Rousseau, Jean-Jacques. 1979. Emile, translated by Allan Bloom. New York: Basic Books.

---. 1997a. Political Economy, in The Social Contract and Other Later Political Writings, edited by Victor Gourevitch. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

---. 1997b. The Discourses and Other Early Political Writings, edited by Victor Gourevitch. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

---. 2005. "On Wealth." In Collected Works, vol. 11. pp. 6-17. Edited by Christopher Kelly; translated by Christopher Kelly and Judith Bush. Hanover, New Hampshire: Dartmouth College Press.