Rousseau and Hobbes: Nature, Free Will, and the Passions

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Robin Douglass, Rousseau and Hobbes: Nature, Free Will, and the Passions, Oxford University Press, 2015, 220pp., $66.00 (bhk), ISBN 9780198724964.

Reviewed by Richard Velkley, Tulane University


In this thoughtful, gracefully written and impressively-researched book, Robin Douglass begins with a remark of Rousseau in a letter to the economist Marquis de Mirabeau, that the problem of politics is to find a form of government where law is placed above man, and should this never be found, it is necessary to turn to the other extreme "and establish the most arbitrary despotism, or 'the most perfect Hobbism'" (2). This remark, which shows how very near Rousseau is to being a Hobbist, nicely sets the stage for Douglass's statement of his purpose, namely, to show that "some of Roussseau's most important philosophical ideas were either set out in direct opposition to Hobbes, or developed in an anti-Hobbesian context." In so arguing, he produces "an original interpretation of Rousseau's political philosophy, which stresses and interweaves aspects of his thought that are frequently understated or neglected" (4). Although Rousseau mentions Hobbes in his writings only a few times and there is no definitive evidence that he read Hobbes, the examination of Rousseau's texts discloses that he "did take very seriously problems of a distinctively Hobbesian nature, occasionally leading him to endorse positions that resembled Hobbes's theory, although more often to set his position out in opposition to Hobbes" (7). Thus Rousseau's thought is neither straightforwardly Hobbesian nor anti-Hobbesian (8, 189). Douglas claims that the true complexity of the relationship of the two thinkers can emerge only through careful historical consideration of the intellectual context of Rousseau's polemical mode of writing. (Douglass avows his debt to Quentin Skinner and the Cambridge approach to the history of ideas.) Accordingly, he makes a distinctive contribution to understanding the Rousseau-Hobbes relation by stressing the milieu of French engagement with Hobbes's thought, extending from the period of the English philosopher's exile in Paris to the mid-eighteenth century. Douglass states that his is the first study of Rousseau to examine in depth the polemical nature of Rousseau's invocations of Hobbes (192).

The study has the merit of relating the expressly political themes of the social pact, law and sovereignty to the confrontation between Rousseau and Hobbesian philosophy concerning human nature, free will and the passions (note the book's subtitle). Douglass shows that Rousseau enters a debate that involves the modern natural law theorists who are critics of Hobbes (Pufendorf, Burlamaqui, Barbeyrac, the translator of Grotius and Pufendorf). The argument of the Discourse on the Origins of Inequality concerning natural man and the origins of society is directed against these theorists as well as against Hobbes (61-63), and Rousseau accomplishes in it the shocking ploy of exposing the natural law critics of Hobbes "as being far more Hobbesian than they would have ever admitted, while at the same time setting out his [Rousseau's] own thought in opposition to both" (192). It is not a small matter to be considered a Hobbist in the eighteenth century, when Hobbes is paired with Spinoza as the most subversive of all philosophers. (Of course Rousseau himself soon equals or surpasses them in that reputation.) The natural law critics are joined by others (Montesquieu, Diderot) who reject Hobbes's account of the pre-social natural state of war and its grounding of civil society and politics. (46-58). But Rousseau presses the point that Hobbes's critics agree with him that the original human condition is, if not a state of war, one of hardship and misery, requiring the ameliorating invention of arts and commerce. Such defenders of luxury and commerce (doux commerce) object to Rousseau's attack on the arts, luxury and commerce in his Discourse on the Arts and Sciences. The Discourse on the Origins of Inequality that follows (which grows out of the response to the criticism of the earlier work, in Douglass's account) puts forth its revolutionary theory of the natural goodness of the human and its original condition, according to which Hobbes, his natural law critics and the doux commerce theorists share the error of supposing that the passions causing human misery, chiefly "inflamed amour-propre," are natural to the human.

The critical response to Hobbes has been inadequate, Rousseau argues, due to its failure to grasp the historical contingency of the misery-causing passions and to see that original human nature is free of them. Yet Rousseau makes this move by an appeal to Hobbes in which he takes further Hobbes's view of the human as originally governed by passion (self-preservation and amour-propre) and as unaware of the "metaphysical" principles of right ascribed to natural reason by natural law theorists (68). Hobbes was radical but insufficiently so: "Hobbes very clearly saw the defect of all modern definitions of natural right: but the conclusions he draws from his own definition show that he understands it in a sense that is no less false."[1] Hobbes should have seen that his insight into the human as passion-governed leads in another direction: "Above all, let us not conclude with Hobbes that because he has no idea of goodness man is naturally wicked, that he is vicious because he does not know virtue".[2] Hobbes's error is shared by all fundamental political thinkers prior to Rousseau: "The philosophers who have examined the foundations of society have all felt the necessity of going back as far as the state of nature, but none of them has reached it."[3] Hobbes like all the others attributed to original humanity passions that could arise only in society. Thus Rousseau would unmask the failure of the whole tradition, Hobbesian as well as anti-Hobbesian, with the help of Hobbes. This is one of several paradoxical inversions performed by Rousseau.

Douglass therefore takes issue with interpreters who have read Rousseau as simply either Hobbesian or anti-Hobbesian. A leading figure in the first camp is Leo Strauss, whose "influence looms large" over contemporary, especially American, Hobbes scholarship. In Strauss's account, it was on Hobbesian principles that "Rousseau originated the first crisis of modern thought by abandoning nature, or human nature, as a basis of right" (4).[4] That abandonment emerges through the historicizing of the state of nature that Strauss argues is "the outcome of a criticism of Hobbes's doctrine which is based on Hobbes's premises."[5] Contra Strauss, Douglass defends the view that Rousseau has a regulative normative account of nature as he uses the state of nature as a model for the good life and for the best political order. It is notable, though, that Douglass agrees essentially with Strauss's formulation that Rousseau historicizes the state of nature and that he criticizes Hobbes on Hobbesian grounds. Douglass departs from other interpreters (Arthur Melzer, Laurence Cooper) who stress natural goodness or nature in Rousseau but do not find that he employs it in his account of political life, principally Of the Social Contract (11). The primary burden of Douglass's book is to show that Rousseau employs the principle of natural goodness, which Douglass says constitutes the most important difference between Rousseau and Hobbes (197), to address problems of a Hobbesian character and thereby to justify a conception of political order. Again, the differences as well as the affinities between Hobbes and Rousseau are in play.

Douglass offers a detailed account of the Hobbesian positions Rousseau accepts concerning the foundations and requirements of political life: (1) As already noted, natural man is a passionate being rather than governed by reason. (2) Political life grounds its justification on the natural passionate state. (3) An absolute sovereign is a required as response to the disorderly passions. (4) The unity of the state secured by the sovereign is threatened by religion's claims to independent authority and by its otherworldly goals, and so political and religious authority must be united under one head. (5) The passions must be cultivated to support the life of the unified political order.

Then Douglass shows how, in each of these areas, Rousseau makes major modifications in Hobbes's views: (1) Hobbes's passions of fearful self-preservation and amour-propre are replaced in Rousseau by amour de soi (i.e., benign amour-propre that does not yet make comparisons and seek the good opinion of others) and pity. (2) The unruly passions that necessitate the creation of society and conventional law belong to original nature in Hobbes, but in Rousseau they are the result of a deterioration of a peaceful, happy epoch. Rousseau concedes that Hobbes's account of passion is accurate for social life. (3) The absolute sovereign that assures unity is an individual or group to which the majority alienates its freedom in Hobbes, but in Rousseau it is the will of all, expressing the will of each, whereby law (the general will as legislative) rules in a way to allow the exercise of free will by each. (4) Hobbes's project of university education in materialist scientific principles, conducted by the sovereign, is replaced in Rousseau by a civil religion that directs pious feeling toward the civil order, solving the problem of the "two fatherlands" that afflicts Christianity. (5) Hobbes's redirection of passions to bring about a peaceful order makes use of fear directed toward the sovereign and the squelching of glory-seeking amour-propre, whereas Rousseau's lawgiver-educator cultivates love for the earthly city, its laws, traditions and deities, and fosters amour-propre as pride in performing the duties of citizenship.

The concluding chapter is an excellent discussion of Rousseau's insistence that the best political order cannot be realized in modern states.

All of this Douglass expounds with exquisite care, detail, and mastery of the sources. I recommend his study for the admirable ambition and complexity of its important project and for the learned, probing and lucid way it executes it. I conclude all the same with a few critical observations.

Concerning the republic grounded on the sovereign general will, Douglass says Rousseau gives it two purposes: to bring about harmony between amour de soi and amour-propre, in the best case forestalling their conflict (15, 198), and to secure the expression of the free will of individuals (102-103). As having these ends the political order is measured by "man's inalienable gifts of nature" that provide a normative standard (11). Free will, Douglass claims, is one of those gifts, and in his account the most important differences between Rousseau and Hobbes are in their opposing accounts of natural goodness and free will (102, 193). Douglass maintains with great energy that Rousseau is a metaphysical dualist and that he requires a non-materialist account of freedom in order to make the distinction between physical and moral force against Hobbes's account of legitimate authority (12-14, 195). He relies on the brief statement in the Discourse on the consciousness of freedom as evidence for the spirituality of the soul and also on the Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar in Emile. Putting aside doubts about whether the Vicar can be identified with Rousseau (and Douglass sets them aside quickly), it should be noted that the Vicar's claims about the soul's immateriality are tentative: "We do not know ourselves; we know neither our nature nor our active principle. We hardly know if man is a simple or a compound being . . . Man is therefore free in his actions and as such is animated by an immaterial substance. This is my third article of faith" (my emphasis).[6] Douglass rightly distinguishes between Rousseau's view of freedom as consciousness of acquiescing in, resisting, or choosing between inclinations, and Kantian autonomy, with its radical independence of reason from inclination, and he points out that freedom in Rousseau's conception is compatible with profound will-formation by tutors and lawgivers (167-73, 196). The decisive thing for Rousseau is the sentiment of freedom as the sense that "actions are performed willingly and the will is never in opposition to -- or its determination as being perceived as dependent on -- the will of any other man" (169). It is hard to see why this sentiment needs to be more than psychological in order to have the central place in human self-satisfaction and happiness that it has for Rousseau. At the same time, Rousseau is able to avoid metaphysical materialism without substance dualism: he could learn from Locke how to be agnostic about substance.

Douglass offers no explanation of how simple, uncorrupted natural sentiments become disordered passions. He speaks of the influence of technical advances, social relations and institutions. But what is the origin         of these? It seems they arise from the same human nature that they corrupt, and nothing extraneous intervenes. So one must ask how the products of sound, original nature can be harmful to their producer. Evidently there is a self-transforming process and a natural power that enables it. Rousseau names it: perfectibility, or "the faculty of perfecting oneself: a faculty which, with the aid of circumstances, successively develops all others."[7] Rousseau says that he is quite certain that this distinguishes humans from other animals, whereas there is "some room for disagreement" about the spiritual power of free will. Douglass briefly mentions perfectibility twice without elaboration, not even offering a basic definition. It is the locus, however, of a highly sophisticated reflection in Rousseau on the relation between passion and thinking, or their mutual determination, in which passion stimulates thinking, resulting in the invention of ideas, which in turn modifies the passions, motivating more invention.

Language has a crucial role in this process, and Douglass notes that affinities between Hobbes and Rousseau on the relations between passion, invention and language have been the subject of scholarly inquiry (99 - 100).[8] The account of language in the second Discourse highlights a kind of productive imagination connected with foresight, whereby humans think archetypes or general ideas. This is the core of perfectibility, for there are no limits to the formation of archetypes. Douglass passes over the central role Rousseau gives the topic in the account of the origin of the social passions and institutions, wherewith humans enslave themselves. One might admit sadly, Rousseau says, that "this distinctive and almost unlimited faculty is the source of all man's miseries" for it "eventually makes him his own and nature's tyrant."[9]

Emile has rich, extended accounts of this productive or creative imagination and how it is the root of human misery and triumph. Douglass discusses a passage in Emile on the educational project of will-formation, where the topic is very much present, although he does not make the connection. In his paraphrasing, the passage states that "our unhappiness consists 'in disproportion between our desires and faculties.' To make men happy and well-ordered entails diminishing the excess of desires over faculties and putting power and will in perfect equality'" (168). This states succinctly the problem posed by perfectibility: it expands ideas beyond immediate needs, creating new desires for luxuries or unattainable goods, thus causing conflict between powers and desires. This expansion brings about the many forms of dependence destroying simple self-sufficiency and above all social dependence. The idea of natural goodness can be reformulated as proportion between powers and desires, or human self-equality, and it is the norm or ideal that should govern the life of both individuals and society. (Rousseau in his autobiographical writings argues that the solitary thinker can come closer to attaining it than any society.) But what draws humans away from this equality? Rousseau in the neighborhood of the cited passage puts it thus: "It is imagination which extends for us the measure of the possible, whether good or bad, and which consequently excites and nourishes the desires by the hope of satisfying them . . . The real world has its limits; the imaginary world is infinite." [10]

[1] Discourses and Other Political Writings, ed. Gourevitch, Cambridge University Press, 1997, 151.

[2] Ibid., 151.

[3] Ibid., 132.

[4] Strauss, Natural Right and History (University of Chicago Press, 1953), 273-74.

[5] Ibid., 269.

[6] Emil or On Education, trans. A Bloom (Basic Books, 1979), 268. 281.

[7] Discourses, 141.

[8] See Philip Pettit, Made with Words: Hobbes on Language, Mind and Politics (Princeton University Press, 2008).

[9] Discourses, 141.

[10] Emile, 80-81.