Rousseau and Revolution

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Holger Ross Lauritsen and Mikkel Thorup (eds.), Rousseau and Revolution, Continuum, 2011, 224pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441128973.

Reviewed by David Lay Williams, DePaul University


Jean-Jacques Rousseau is perhaps most famous or even infamous for two features associated with his work and its influence. Among casual readers, he is known as the muse of the Jacobins in the French Revolution. The popular image persists of Robespierre quoting passages from the Social Contract while simultaneously ordering executions. Among more familiar readers, he is known for the many paradoxes and ambiguities that cover most corners of his oeuvre. He can be found advancing ancient and modern devices, celebrating the solitary life while insisting on the social, condemning the arts while writing novels and operas, and insisting that freedom involves being forced against one's evident will. These two features come together in the new edited volume, Rousseau and Revolution, which probes the many ambiguities in Rousseau's political writings to explore whether or not he is properly understood as a muse for revolutionaries, whether in France or elsewhere. The volume, written by scholars from Europe and the United States and drawn from a 2009 conference held in Aarhus, Denmark, consists of eleven essays plus an introduction.

To be sure, Rousseau and the general will were very clearly in the air during the French Revolution -- on both sides. This spirit is well-captured by Eric Thompson, who observes, "From 1789 onwards it [the 'general will'] became a constant phrase on the lips of the Palais Royal orators; it was repeated endlessly in the popular journals and in the speeches of deputies in the Assembly itself. It was constantly heard in the Jacobin Club and in the branches later established by it throughout the country."[1] To make any claims to legitimacy, one had to associate one's own principles with Rousseau's general will. In January of 1789, the Abbé Sieyès demanded that if France were really serious about the general will, then it had to bolster the power of the Third Estate.[2] By July of the same year, this demand was manifested in the Decree upon the National Assembly, which now posited that the "interpretation and presentation of the general will of the nation belong" to the National Assembly.[3] The very next month, the same National Assembly would issue its Declaration of the Rights of Man, which expressly asserted, "The law is an expression of the general will." To understand the power of Rousseau's immediate influence, however, one need only consult the response of Louis XVI before the National Assembly, where he promised to "defend and maintain constitutional liberty, whose principles the general will, in accord with my own, has sanctioned."[4] Rousseau was a clear presence throughout the Revolution.

Of course, this history is by no means a happy one. As is well known, Robespierre had a deep affection for what he took to be Rousseau's political philosophy, even calling Rousseau "divine."[5] He latched onto the general will very early in the Revolution, following Sieyès in questioning any law that does not originate from the general will.[6] Along these lines, Fayçal Falaky observes, "The adoration surrounding Rousseau did indeed reach religious and cultish dimensions, . . . [approaching] a Christ-like magnitude" (88). As Jason Neidleman, has observed, "The Jacobins' claim to embody the general will become a justification for almost anything they did."[7]

There are clearly passages in Rousseau that lend themselves to the revolutionary spirit. As Julian Bourg (59-60) and Antoine Hatzenberger (157) quote him, sometimes in the life of a state there are

periods of violence . . . when revolutions do to peoples what certain crises do to individuals, when the horror of the past takes the place of forgetting, and when the State aflame with civil wars is so to speak reborn from its ashes and recovers the vigor of youth as it escapes death's embrace (SC, 2.8.3).[8]

In this spirit, Rousseau occasionally treats revolutions as inevitable. Blaise Bachofen (19) draws our attention to a passage from Emile: "You trust in the present order of society without thinking that this order is subject to inevitable revolutions. . . . The noble become commoners, the rich become poor, the monarch becomes subject. . . . We are approaching a state of crisis and the age of revolutions."[9]

At the same time, however, as several of the essays indicate, Rousseau is highly skeptical of revolutions and the violence that attends them. As Bachofen (17) observes, Rousseau pledged as a young man "never to be party to any civil war, and never to uphold domestic freedom with arms."[10] This personal commitment is articulated as principle in his Emile:

let us protect the public order. In every country let us respect the laws, let us not disturb the worship they prescribe; let us not lead the citizens to disobedience. For we do not know whether it is a good thing for them to abandon their opinions in exchange for others, and we are very certain that it is an evil thing to disobey the laws.[11]

And as Christiane Mossin (135) quotes Rousseau, subjects should always be dubious of those promising to release them from their chains: "their revolutions almost always deliver them up to seducers who only increase their chains."[12]

Readers might be disappointed to know that the essays in this volume do not offer a unified definitive resolution to this underlying tension in Rousseau's works. He is ultimately too slippery on the matter to lend himself to such unanimity among interpreters. Many of the essays, however, do offer greater insight into his thoughts on revolution, continuity, disruption, and order that make it well worth reading.

The volume is divided into three parts: (1) Democracy and Violence, (2) Philosophy and Political Change, and (3) Revolution and History. In Part I, Blaise Bachofen argues for a largely conservative Rousseau, emphasizing some of the passages cited above. He contrasts his Rousseau with Locke, who is depicted as evincing a greater "anthropological optimism" (22) insofar as Locke trusts his people to wield revolutions wisely. By contrast, Bachofen's Rousseau lacks this optimism that a "brutalized and stupid people" (22)[13]could sensibly employ a revolutionary right. Bachofen's analysis is largely solid, although he fails to note that in the very same paragraph where Rousseau refers to the "stupid people," he also notes that the inevitable solution to the problems leading to the people being robbed of their intelligence has historically been "recourse to force . . . when it was necessary to protect themselves."[14] To be fair, Bachofen acknowledges this revolutionary strain in Rousseau, but observes that the people must be educated in order for them to revolt legitimately (24-30). For him, this helps explain the emphasis on education in the Emile and Government of Poland.

Jane Anna Gordon's essay, "The General Will and National Consciousness: Radical Requirements of Democratic Legitimacy in the Writing of Rousseau and Fanon," is less focused on Rousseau than on echoes of his thought in the post-colonial work of Frantz Fanon. Gordon would do well to acknowledge that Fanon's direct appropriation of Rousseau in his most famous works is admittedly minimal; he fails to cite Rousseau even once in his Wretched of the Earth and Black Skin, White Masks. So Gordon's task is best understood as identifying similarities rather than direct influence. She claims to find this in their shared methods, support for liberation, rejection of natural slavery, emphasis on equality, and openness to violence as a means of political change. The essay succeeds at this level, though the reader wonders what is special about Rousseau in this regard, as compared with other canonical (or non-canonical) figures who can roughly be said to embrace the same ideas.

Julian Bourg revisits the historical question of whether on not the Terror was principally inspired by Rousseau's works. His essay offers a useful history of the rhetorical employment of Rousseau in various stages of the Revolution. He notes that through 1793 Rousseau was appreciated and cited, but not revered as a quasi-deity. Nor, he suggests, is there much evidence to link Rousseau to the Terror through 1794, since this stage of the Revolution "was emergency government and not the general will" (58). Halfway through the essay, Bourg then changes course to ask whether or not Rousseau's works would have lent themselves to support the Terror. Here he acknowledges ambiguity in the Social Contract, insofar as there appear to be passages suggesting both violence and quietude.

Angelica Nuzzo's essay, "Arbitrariness and Freedom: Hegel on Rousseau and Revolution," is the last in Part I, and like Gordon's, it seeks to understand Rousseau partly through another figure: in this case,G. W. F. Hegel. Nuzzo's essay, however, has an advantage unavailable to Gordon: Hegel was a careful reader of Rousseau -- at first as a student, and then as a critic. He was known as a pupil to neglect his required readings in seminary in order to consume Rousseau's writings; and he was remembered amongst his peers for writing "Vive Jean-Jacques" in his classmates' yearbooks.[15] Later on, however, as Nuzzo notes, Hegel would reverse course and accuse Rousseau's conception of the general will of an arbitrariness that justifiably connected it to the worst elements of Revolution. Nuzzo's essay offers a sophisticated and somewhat sympathetic reading of Hegel's treatment of Rousseau, taking account of the evolution of his reading over time. Because Rousseau's conception of the will is effectively the Kantian Willkür, he fails to distinguish the general will from the will of all. It is not entirely clear that this interpretation holds in the face of Rousseau's efforts to insist that "What is good . . . is so by the nature of things and independently of human conventions,"[16] but Nuzzo demonstrates that Hegel's arguments demand serious consideration.

Part II offers a less coherently linked set of essays. In "Reverse Revolution: The Paradox of Rousseau's Authorship," Fayçal Falaky follows Bourg to a degree in outlining a history of the zeal for Rousseau's works in the Revolution, but with an emphasis on how little his greatest champions had actually read his texts. Falaky also deviates from Bourg insofar as he finds the revolutionaries more infatuated with the Genevan, elevating him to a "Christ-like magnitude," a status that was confirmed by Rousseau's persecution and suffering (88). In the end, however, for Falaky, "it was . . . Rousseau's spirit that dominated and not precisely his letter" (96).

Holger Ross Lauritsen's "The General Will between Conservation and Revolution" in some ways parallels Bachofen's opening essay, insofar as he outlines both Rousseau's conservative and revolutionary tendencies. Lauritsen, however, traces the conservative and revolutionary tendencies, respectively, to the general will's indivisibility and inalienability. He pursues reconciliation of these contradictory impulses in Rousseau in what he calls "revolutionary government" (109-11), embodied in the impetus to "continue the revolution by organizing constant popular uprisings" (109), which he associates with Maoism. Lauritsen acknowledges that this reading is not what Rousseau actually advocated (111), but thinks it is within the spirit of Rousseau. It is difficult, however, to see how this reading might be reconciled with Rousseau's more conservative tendencies, such as his caution that "changes are always dangerous."[17]

Bertel Nygaard's "Rousseau and Revolution in the Making of a Modern Political Culture: Denmark 1750-1850" is addressed to a fairly specific subset of scholars: those interested in Rousseau's role in the development of Danish political culture. In this way, it resembles Paul Sperlin's Rousseau in America1760-1809 (1976). Like Sperlin's book, it reveals mostly interesting tidbits and not a fundamental motor driving its history. The Danes certainly read and even respected Rousseau, but he cannot be said to have had the influence of other figures, such as Hegel.

Opening up Part III, Christiane Mossin's "Creation, Destruction, and Continuity of Order" offers one of the book's most philosophically engaging essays. Mossin focuses on Rousseau's attention to the question of what kind of people are fit to receive laws. Must they be "already bound together by some union of origin, interest, or convention" or should they be free from "deep-rooted customs" and "deep-rooted superstitions"?[18] Rousseau demands both simultaneously. Mossin notes, however, that these demands are fundamentally different, characterizing them respectively as the path of continuity and the path of destruction (139). For Mossin, these paths are incompatible -- one requiring that political society be built on the foundations of a preexisting civilization and the other insisting, as Rousseau writes in the Second Discourse, that the Lawgiver would "begin by purging the threshing floor and setting aside all the old materials, as Lycurgus did in Sparta, in order afterwards to erect a good Building."[19] Mossin looks to resolve this tension by emphasizing that what most needs to be created at the founding is civic virtue (141). In this regard, she emphasizes both the education of Emile and the institution of civil religion as crucial for grasping Rousseau's radical demands on national foundations.

Antoine Hatzenberger's "Rousseau and the Revolutions of the Earth: Remarks on a Natural Metaphor" is the shortest essay in the collection and the most difficult to place. It opens with an extended excerpt from Deleuze (almost the entire introduction) on the inevitable disappointments of revolution and then goes on to consider the Corsican revolution, which understood itself as "having recovered its liberty" (158). Hatzenberger draws attention to parallels in this event to natural metaphors found in the Second Discourse with unclear results. The essay is more evocative than argumentative.

The volume's penultimate essay, Masano Yamashita's "The Revolutionary Return of the Orator: Public Space and the Spoken Word in the Work of Jean-Jacques Rousseau," seeks to understand Rousseau's writings as the eighteenth century Habermasian public-sphere manifestation of ancient republican oral speech. Rousseau writes his public "Letter to d'Alembert," for example, as a way to advance public opinion in a more virtuous direction (170). Rousseau's contributions to the public discourse in this regard are undeniable, though the reader wonders how this might distinguish him from other public literary figures, such as Voltaire. Further, it is unclear how this essay connects in any way to the volume's overall theme.

The book concludes with James Swenson's "Rousseau, the Revolution, and the Republic," which outlines the republican dimensions of Rousseau's political philosophy, where republicanism is associated less with the general will than with a particular a way of life (179-80). He employs Rousseau's Government of Poland to illustrate his republicanism's core principle: "No constitution will ever be good and solid unless the law rules the citizens' hearts" (183).[20] Swenson emphasizes those less-celebrated passages in Rousseau that privilege mores over laws accompanied by sanction (less celebrated certainly than "forced to be free"). The point is to have citizens who want to act civically, rather than those who only do so reluctantly by virtue of a quasi-Hobbesian threat of punishment. Swenson traces how this principle informs the system of graduated promotions in Rousseau's proposal for the Polish constitution. This connects Swenson's essay to the volume's theme, insofar as it reveals Rousseau to embrace a relatively conservative principle of slow change. Insofar as the Lawgiver establishes these mores, he represents this conservative principle. Insofar as the Lawgiver enters almost as a deus ex machina, he embodies Rousseau's revolutionary tendencies.

In an age where revolutions are sweeping the Middle East, it seems as good a time as any to reconsider the principles on which revolutions are grounded. This reason alone is sufficient to reconsider Jean-Jacques Rousseau's relationship to the French Revolution and political change. But these essays also invite students of Rousseau to consider his works more generally. While this volume does not answer once and for all the timeless questions raised by his political thought, one at least takes a few steps toward a more sophisticated political philosophy through engaging its essays.

[1] Eric Thompson, Popular Sovereignty and the French Constituent Assembly, 1789-91 (Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1952), p. 35.

[2] Emanuel Joseph Sieyès, What is the Third Estate? in Political Writings, ed. Michael Sonenscher (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, [1789] 2003), p. 111.

[3] National Assembly of France, Decree upon the National Assembly in The Communist Manifesto and Other Revolutionary Writings, ed. Bob Blaisdell (Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, [1789] 2003), p. 76.

[4] Louis XVI, quoted in Simon Schama, Citizens: A Chronicle of the French Revolution (New York: Vintage Books, 1989), p. 323.

[5] Maximilien Robespierre, “Dedication to Jean-Jacques Rousseau,” quoted in Carol Blum, Rousseau and the Republic of Virtue: The Language of Politics in the French Revolution (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1986), p. 156.

[6] Maximilien Robespierre, “On the Right to Vote,” in Robespierre, ed., George Rudé (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, [1791] 1967), p. 14.

[7] Jason Andrew Neidleman, The General Will Is Citizenship: Inquiries into French Political Thought (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2001), pp. 92-93. 

[8] All references to the Social Contract are to book, chapter, and paragraph numbers found in The Social Contract and Other Later Political Writings, ed. Victor Gourevitch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, [1772] 1997).

[9] Emileor On Education, trans. Allan Bloom (New York: Basic Books, [1762] 1979), p. 194.  He continues in a footnote here, “I hold it impossible that the great monarchies of Europe still have long to last.  All have shined, and every state which shines is on decline.  I have reasons more particular than this maxim for my opinion, but it is unseasonable to tell them, and everyone sees too well.”

[10] Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Confessions, in The Confessions and Correspondence, including the Letters to Malesherbes, ed. Christopher Kelly, Roger D. Masters, and Peter G. Stillman (Hanover, NH: University Press of New England, 1995), p. 181.

[11] Emile, p. 310. 

[12] Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Discourse on the Origins and Foundations of Inequality Among Men or Second Discourse, in The Discourses and Other Early Political Writings, ed. Victor Gourevitch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, [1754] 1997), p. 115.

[13] See Rousseau’s Letters Written from the Mountain in Letter to Beaumont, Letters Written form the Mountain, and Related Writings, ed. Christopher Kelly and Eve Grace (Hanover, NH: The University Press of New England, [1764] 2001), p. 299. 

[14] Letters Written from the Mountain, p. 300. 

[15] See Terry Pinkard, Hegel: A Biography (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001), 27.

[16] Social Contract, 2.6.2.

[17] Social Contract, 3.18.3.

[18] Social Contract, 2.10.5.

[19] Second Discourse, p. 175.

[20] Jean-Jacques Rousseau, The Government of Poland in The Social Contract and Other Later Political Writings, ed. Victor Gourevitch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, [1772] 1997), p. 179.